Practices of the Self

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Charles Larmore, Practices of the Self, University of Chicago Press, 2010, 201pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226468877.

Reviewed by Carol Rovane, Columbia University


This is an English translation of a book that Larmore originally published in French. One of the main virtues of the book is that it brings into relation important work in both the Anglophone and Francophone philosophical literature of the twentieth century, and it does so for the sake of a goal that is particularly well served by this approach, which is to elaborate a coherent ideal of authenticity.

Larmore starts with Lionel Trilling's distinction between sincerity and authenticity -- the distinction between showing oneself to others as one is, vs. being oneself. Although some philosophers view the latter ideal, of authenticity, as requiring some sort of fidelity to one's true self, Larmore dismisses such views as "hackneyed" and, on this ground, he declines to engage with Charles Taylor's work on authenticity (and perhaps underestimates it as well). Instead, he takes as his framing issue a difficulty that Sartre raised, which is that reflection splits the self and thereby makes the task of being oneself a problem, because one cannot simultaneously be oneself while also taking oneself as an object of reflection. The difficulty isn't that one would no longer be oneself in either of the usual senses we might distinguish -- that one would no longer be a self in any sense at all, or that one would still be a self, only not one's self, because one would have become another self (i.e., someone else). The difficulty is rather that, once reflection has had its splitting effect, any effort to be oneself would involve bad faith.

Larmore seeks to solve Sartre's difficulty through a set of joint recommendations: the self is to be conceived in practical terms, as consisting in a body of commitments; this practical conception of the self is to be allied with a normativist conception of mental states as commitments; two notions of reflection are to be distinguished -- practical reflection vs. cognitive reflection. The solution on offer is that while cognitive reflection incurs Sartre's difficulty, practical reflection does not -- so authenticity is possible, and it consists in having the right practical relation to one's commitments.

In the course of his larger argument, Larmore makes some detailed claims that are not all equally compelling and don't all hang together perfectly well, and at times even seem to involve confusions. Yet as I bring this out, we'll see that it doesn't really spoil the power and promise of his overall strategy.

Let me start with Larmore's idea of a commitment and how it brings in train his normativist conception of mind. Although he claims to have taken the idea over from Brandom, he distances himself from Brandom on certain crucial points and ends up with a view that is strikingly close to that of his former colleague, Isaac Levi -- for he emphasizes the very lessons from Peirce and Dewey that drive Levi's entire epistemology and taxonomy of mind. On this view, the various states and episodes that constitute the life of the mind -- ordinary psychological attitudes such as beliefs and desires -- are commitments in the following specific sense: they are undertakings to live up to their normative contents. This contrasts with a much more commonly held naturalistic conception of psychological attitudes as causal dispositions to think and behave in accord with their contents. On the latter conception, it is conceptually guaranteed that what we actually do must accord with our psychological attitudes; whereas on the normativist conception this is not conceptually guaranteed -- there is room for the idea that we may still hold certain psychological attitudes even if we fail to act in accord with them. What we actually do (what Levi calls our "performances") may fail to accord with our commitments, without compromising the idea that we still have those commitments, so long as we are prepared to take those failures as occasions for self-criticism.

Armed with the idea of a commitment, Larmore goes on to characterize practical reflection as a way of taking up our commitments. "Taking up" seems like "adopting" -- that is, moving from a state in which we don't hold certain commitments to a state in which we do. But this doesn't seem to be what he has in mind, because moving to new commitments would involve deliberation, and he categorizes deliberation as cognitive rather than practical reflection. The function of practical reflection that he sees as crucial for his project of elaborating a coherent ideal of authenticity is a quite different one, which is to monitor how well one is living up to one's commitments. This does seem to make intuitive sense. If the goal of authenticity is the goal of being oneself, and if the self is a body of commitments, then the goal of authenticity is plausibly equated with the goal of living up to one's commitments, and meeting this goal would obviously be facilitated by the sort of practical reflection through which we monitor how well we are living up to our commitments.

Larmore claims that such practical reflection does not land us in Sartre's difficulty on the following interesting ground: the proper objects of practical reflection are not our selves, he says, but rather the objects of the commitments that constitute us -- which I take to be such things as the truths we believe and the values we embrace (or perhaps the things we value). It seems to me that this might plausibly be said of many mental processes that we normally think of as 'reflective' or 'self-conscious' -- including some that Larmore wants to associate with cognitive reflection. But, oddly, it doesn't fit well with his account of the main function of practical reflection. I cannot monitor how well I am living up to my commitments just by focusing on their objects -- on what I take to be true and valuable; I need to turn my attention back on myself and consider how well my own doings are in accord with what I take to be true and valuable. This doesn't necessarily mean that practical reflection as Larmore understands it would split the self in the way that Sartre warned against. What it means is that he has at some points misstated his case for thinking that it doesn't.

The refrain in Larmore's discussion of cognitive reflection is that it yields knowledge of oneself that is like knowledge of another. Knowledge of others is often portrayed as having an explanatory aim: we ascribe psychological attitudes to someone in order to explain why they act as they do. This explanatory aim cannot be achieved without doing some interpretive work, in which we take due account of how the contents of psychological attitudes rationalize actions -- how they count as reasons. Philosophers who don't share Larmore's normativist conception of mind see no tension between the project of giving such rationalizing explanations of action and a conception of psychological attitudes as causal dispositions to behave. In their view deliberations are causal processes by which psychological attitudes issue in the sorts of actions that it would be rational for anyone with those attitudes to perform. If we construe the sort of self-knowledge that cognitive reflection yields on this model of our knowledge of others, then it involves an objectification of ourselves in a fairly literal sense: we are not being ourselves in the active sense that goes with undertaking commitments and living up to them, but instead we are spectators who are explaining and predicting our own actions in exactly the same way that we would explain and predict anyone else's.

If this were all that Larmore had in mind by cognitive reflection, then we could fairly complain that his distinction between practical and cognitive reflection is not quite so novel as he at times suggests, but really just a new articulation of a longstanding distinction that many philosophers have discussed before him -- between the first-person point of view vs. the third, the agent's perspective vs. the observer's, the stance of intending vs. predicting, etc. However, one aspect of Larmore's account of cognitive reflection seems to place it together with practical reflection on the first side of this longstanding distinction. I'm referring here to his classification of deliberation as a species of cognitive reflection.

On the normativist conception of mind, deliberation is properly viewed as a process in which someone works out the normative implications of her own commitments in order to arrive at conclusions about what she has most reason to think and do. Larmore rightly notes that reasons are impersonal, and he takes it to follow that the particular form of self-knowledge that deliberation deals in is properly conceived as knowledge that is like knowledge of another. Prima facie, this may seem intuitively plausible, since when I work out what I have most reason to do in the light of my commitments, what I thereby come to know about myself applies to anyone who holds the same commitments that I hold.

The trouble is that it doesn't cohere with Larmore's picture of cognitive reflection as splitting the self, for as we shall now see, the very ground on which he claims that practical reflection does not split the self also holds in the case of cognitive reflection when it is construed as deliberation, and indeed it holds in the latter case even more plausibly than it does in the former. Practical reflection is supposed not to split the self because it turns our attention outward, away from ourselves, and towards the objects of our commitments -- which I've glossed as what we take to be true and valuable. I've already brought out that this is not strictly so when we construe the function of such reflection to be that of monitoring how well we are living up to our own commitments. But it is strictly so in the case of deliberation. When I deliberate from my commitments in order to work out what they entail about what I have most reason to do, my attention is entirely focused away from myself and onto the objects of my commitments -- what I take to be true and valuable. And it makes no odds against this claim about the outward focus of deliberation that it is informed by a background reflective understanding of the general and impersonal character of all reasons. The fact that if I think something is true or valuable then I think anyone ought to regard it so does not somehow turn me in on myself. But nor does it make the sort of self-knowledge that figures in my deliberation like knowledge of another, as Larmore so often repeats.

What he seems to be suggesting is that when knowledge of myself is like knowledge of another, I am viewing myself in something like the way I described above in connection with the non-normativist, dispositionalist conception of the mind -- in which case I would be taking a third and not a first-person point of view on myself. But deliberation is a quintessentially first-person affair, and if the self-knowledge it involves incorporates a recognition of the general and impersonal character of all reasons, the accurate thing to say is that the knowledge of others that I thereby gain is like my knowledge of myself. It is normative knowledge of what any other deliberator ought to do if they share my commitments, which I can arrive at only by occupying the first-person point of view of a deliberator. If Sartre was suggesting that this sort of neo-Kantian point about how deliberation involves an apprehension that I am one among all rational beings somehow incurs a split in the self, I guess I just think he was wrong.

In whatever way these details might get sorted out, we can certainly agree with Sartre and Larmore that some forms of reflection do split the self, and that this poses a serious challenge for philosophers who wish to elaborate a coherent ideal of authenticity and also a corollary challenge for philosophers who wish to give an account of self-knowledge that doesn't render us mere spectators with respect to ourselves. Larmore turns to Paul Ricoeur for help with the second challenge and suggests that first-person reports of our psychological attitudes are avowals of our commitments -- a quite different thing from describing psychological facts from a spectator's point of view. He follows up with a tour through some important Anglophone literature on first-person reference and first-person authority. These two discussions alone show the extraordinary range of learning and interests that he is able bring to his project.

But Larmore's range is evident at every turn in the book, as this partial list of the philosophers he discusses will attest: Anscombe, Augustine, Bergson, Berlin, Bourdieu, Brandom, Davidson, de Biran, Dennett, Descartes, Elster, Engel, Fichte, Foucault, Frankfurt, Gauchet, Girard, Habermas, Heidegger, Horwich, Hume, Kleist, La Bruyere, Locke, MacIntyre, Marion, McDowell, Montaigne, Moran, Nabert, Nagel, Petit, Plato, Putnam, Rawls, Raz, Rorty, Rousseau, Ryle, Scanlon, Schopenhauer, Sellars, Shoemaker, Tugendhat, Williams, Wittgenstein, Wright. One feels, somehow, that the future of philosophy must lie in this method that refuses to exclude any serious philosophical attempt to come to grips with its topics.