Praeambula Fidei: Thomism and the God of the Philosophers

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Ralph McInerny, Praeambula Fidei: Thomism and the God of the Philosophers, Catholic University of America Press, 2006, 313pp., $34.95 (pbk), ISBN 0813214580.

Reviewed by Anthony J. Lisska, Denison University


As the twenty-first century begins, the intensity and the breadth of the discussions concerning issues found in the writings of Thomas Aquinas are staggering. What is fascinating in this contemporary rebirth of interest in Aquinas's work is that the years immediately following the Second Vatican Council were considered the death knell to what one might call classical Thomism. Into this vortex of multi-structured discussions of Aquinas's philosophy and theology enters Ralph McInerny, a philosopher well known in Thomistic circles as a staunch proponent of the importance of considering Aquinas as a philosopher. This present book develops traditional Thomism within the context principally of twentieth century objections to reading Aquinas as a philosopher whose work might stand on its own independent of theological underpinnings.

In considering the contemporary work in Aquinas's philosophy and theology, one might delineate three different approaches. There are, first of all, the classical neo-Thomists. Much of this work arose following the impetus for the nineteenth century revival of scholastic Thomism engendered by Leo XIII's Aeterni Patris, the encyclical seen historically as the bellwether in the modern period for the rebirth of serious Thomist studies. This group of classical Thomists may again be divided into at least three sub-categories: [a] Neo-Thomists belonging to what has been called the Aristotelico-Thomistic tradition; [b] Secondly, the Thomists who in the early twentieth century incorporated Kantian insights into their reading of Aquinas; this group is usually referred to as proponents of Transcendental Thomism; [c] A third group following the historical method adopted by Etienne Gilson, among others, who argued that Aquinas's philosophy is not only rooted in the concept of "existence" (esse) but also is dependent conceptually and ontologically on what one might call the Exodus tradition of "I am who Am."

The second major category of scholars interested in Aquinas's work are philosophers deeply immersed in the analytic tradition of Anglo-American philosophy. John Haldane recently coined the term "Analytical Thomism" to distinguish this group from the classical Thomists. One might also note, following the insights of Fergus Kerr, that the earlier analytic Thomists at mid-century might better be called the "Wittgensteinian Thomists" and those later philosophers such as Haldane, Norman Kretzmann and Brian Davies "Analytical Thomists." These philosophers, for the most part, take Aquinas seriously as a philosopher and are not engaged in what they perceive as the somewhat tiresome debate over whether Aquinas was a theologian who merely happened to utter a few significant philosophical claims or rather was one of the great philosophers of the western tradition.

A third significant group contains mostly theologians following the postmodern insights of recent Continental philosophy; these theologians have developed what is called "Radical Orthodoxy," and some have proposed a re-reading of Aquinas's texts in order to support their positions. Catherine Pickstock and John Milbank's Aquinas on Truth would be an example of this kind of analysis. Analytical Thomists such as Anthony Kenny have little truck with Thomists seated under the canopy of radical orthodoxy while David Burrell appears more sympathetic to this genre of Aquinas studies.

These general categories of philosophical analysis have been delineated so that one might have a better idea of where within the recent context of Aquinas studies McInerny's book fits. McInerny's significant philosophical work over the years belongs to the category of neo-Thomists from the more orthodox school immersed in what he calls "Aristotelico-Thomism" (p. 305); nonetheless, he certainly is well acquainted with most Neo-Thomism and Analytical Thomism as well.  In many ways, this thoughtful book is an analysis of the arguments put forward by Aquinas as seen under the philosophical light of classical neo-Thomism. McInerny is at pains to demonstrate that Aquinas not only can be read as a first rate philosopher but also that many twentieth-century accounts that place Aquinas under the lens of too much theological influence are misguided. McInerny is probably an example of what those in intramural scholasticism would call "River Forest Thomism."

This book has two principal sections, with the first providing an in-depth structural analysis of the history of Thomism in the twentieth century as practiced by several important Aquinas commentators who have offered a more theological reading of Aquinas than McInerny judges as correct. Discussions centering on Etienne Gilson, Henri de Lubac and Marie-Dominique Chenu provide the grist for the mill in this informative first section. The second section, which could stand alone, is a structural analysis of the major parts of Aquinas's Commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics where McInerny argues that Aquinas does establish independently of theological concerns that there is a first metaphysical cause that provides the ultimate source for explanation of the created realm. McInerny argues that "Gilson ended by so confining Thomas's philosophy to a theological setting that it is difficult to see how philosophy so understood could be shared by nonbelievers." (p. 159) McInerny insists that Aquinas rejects what Gilson firmly adopted: "the guiding role of the text from Exodus (with) the consequent need to ground the analysis in scripture and faith." (pp. 149-50) He worries that according to Gilson, Aquinas's philosophy "is swallowed up by Theology" and that "Thomas's metaphysics is dependent on revelation and faith …" (p. 155). The two principal sections of this book are, of course, interrelated, in that the second part is the realist philosophical analysis that goes directly against the ontological claims asserted by the triumvirate of Aquinas commentators considered in the first part.

In the first section, McInerny considers principally those readers of Aquinas who developed their interpretative skills in Western Europe during the early and middle parts of the twentieth century. While showing the utmost respect for the work of Etienne Gilson, nonetheless McInerny develops a sustained argument indicating that the much accepted reading of Aquinas through Gilson's lenses is incorrect structurally. This is, I suggest, a good example of what the late Henry B. Veatch, following on the coattails of Gustav Bergmann, once called doing "the structural history of philosophy." McInerny explains the development of what one might call "Continental Thomism" very well. While there are more than several theological crossovers, nonetheless the account of how Gilson, De Lubac and Chenu provide similar accounts of Thomas's philosophical impetus is instructive. One needs to separate, McInerny suggests, the Thomism of the major traditional commentators -- Cajetan, John of St. Thomas (Poinsot) et al -- from the contemporary continental accounts noted above.

Gilson, in particular, appears to have, in McInerny's mind, subjected Cajetan's work to unfair criticism. Cajetan and John of St. Thomas both offer a substantial dichotomy in Aquinas's writings between the theological and the philosophical; furthermore, using an interpretative principle that McInerny accepts, the philosophical components are capable of standing on their own. This is, of course, in opposition to what Gilson developed as his principal interpretive principle in confronting the texts of Aquinas. The same holds for de Lubac and Chenu. McInerny notes that "de Lubac's self image is of a theologian defending St. Thomas against the Thomists." (p. 69) McInerny's mission is, in a sense, to rescue the philosophical Thomism common to the Aristotelico-Thomistic tradition from the muddled accounts of several Continental Thomists. Moreover, in opposition to these Thomistic scholars -- with the Leonine editor R-A. Gauthier exemplifying what McInerny wishes to refute -- McInerny places Aquinas not only as a premier commentator on Aristotle but also one who adopted Aristotelian realism as a justified philosophical position. Jean-Pierre Torrell's recent studies on Aquinas appear to adopt the Gauthier interpretative principles in opposition to McInerny.

Of course, one needs to be fair historically in these discussions. In some ways, Gilson and Chenu, in particular, were concerned, and rightly so, that the classical Thomists had neglected to incorporate historical insights into their readings of Aquinas. Gilson's cache, to his credit, has always been in pushing the historical boundaries in reading the medieval philosophers. McInerny's account of the saga of Chenu that began with a lecture as new rector at his Order's prominent House of Studies, the Saulchoir, is instructive. What I take to be McInerny's worry is that a justified sense of historical awareness should not entail the complete dismissal of the philosophical structure of many of Aquinas's works. What is interesting from the perspective of the development of Roman Catholic history from the mid-nineteenth century until John XXIII "opened the windows" with Vatican II is that prior to the 1960s, both Chenu and de Lubac were personae non gratae within the confines of the intellectual milieu of Roman Catholicism. The French Dominican Garrigou-Lagrange is often seen as the "Commissioner" of the thought police on these matters. Whatever the merits of these historical claims about Garrigou-Lagrange, nonetheless the shadow of Roman Catholicism's worries about "Modernism" with its perceived wholesale adoption of historicism hovers over these discussions. Following Vatican II, with Chenu and De Lubac becoming almost folk heroes, there followed an almost uncompromising rejection of the Thomism that is so dear to McInerny's philosophical soul. McInerny's first section helps those interested in this structural history of philosophy understand better how a specific almost anti-philosophical modality in reading Aquinas replaced the earlier orthodox Neo-Thomism.

One critical worry that emerges in some of McInerny's passages in this book is that any appeal to the Magisterium is a double-edge sword. While, of course, Vatican I did affirm mandated interpretations of Aquinas's scholasticism, it would appear, as Fergus Kerr has recently written, that John-Paul II in Fides et Ratio may have brought an Augustinian perspective to the faith-reason issues. While it may be too early to judge, one suspects that the same holds for the present holder of the Chair of Peter in Rome. McInerny writes that de Lubac "… restored Thomas to the tradition of the Fathers of the Church …" (p. 71). In sorting out these issues, one suspects that it is best to follow the words of Aquinas himself, who always depended on the force of a structured rational argument in order to make sense of a philosophical aporia. In the Quodlibital Questions, Aquinas writes: "It is important to instruct those who are listening, so that they will be brought to an understanding of the truth under consideration. Here one must rely on arguments that probe the root of truth claims and make people know how what is said is true."

McInerny considers in some detail the writings of the continental philosophers and theologians but neglects recent Analytical Thomists such as Haldane, Kretzmann and Davies, who certainly hold Aquinas's philosophical claims as not only discussable but justifiable by means of substantive rational arguments that Aquinas himself adopted. Nonetheless McInerny's account contains informative analyses and reflections mostly unfamiliar to the English speaking philosophical community interested in the work of St. Thomas. This is a significant aspect of this monograph.

The second section develops an explicatio textus of the Commentary on the Metaphysics. McInerny is particularly worried about Book Lambda, where Aristotle with Aquinas in tandem discusses the first ontological principle, which is the First Mover or Necessary Being.  Here McInerny is at pains to show that the earlier twentieth century readings of the Metaphysics by commentators like Werner Jaeger have been refuted substantively by the recent work of Giovanni Reale. Jaeger argued that the ordering of the books of Aristotle's Metaphysics was more or less arbitrary and did not illustrate any semblance of a literary or philosophical whole. McInerny notes that Joseph Owens held this position but, interestingly enough, Franz Brentano rejected it. McInerny accepts the Brentano conclusion endorsed by Reale. McInerny writes that "Reale has done more than anyone else to make Thomas's reading of the Metaphysics justified." (p. 162) In effect, McInerny needs Brentano's and Reale's interpretative claim in order to demonstrate that Aquinas had an Aristotelian architectonic in mind as he pursued his development of this Commentary. Aquinas worked within the interpretative principle that there is a philosophical unity in Aristotle's Metaphysics that is clearly illustrated in his own Commentary. McInerny argues that while the principal object of a metaphysical argument is an analysis of primary substance, nonetheless a deeper reflection indicates that this primary substance is an ontologically dependent entity. This leads to the ontological postulation of an esse per se subsistens, all of which happens on the philosophical level and is not, following Gilson, dependent on the Book of Exodus. Kerr once noted that it is likely that Kenny's rather trenchant comments on Aquinas's analysis of being are rooted in a Gilsonian understanding of Aquinas's ontology.

To justify this analysis, McInerny proposes that Aquinas held continually for a real distinction between essence (that what is -- "quod est") and existence (that by which something is -- "esse"). This, McInerny argues, was Aquinas's position all along, as it can be traced back to his early writings on Boethius. Hence, this distinction is affirmed philosophically independent of theological principles. Granting McInerny's analysis, it follows that the principal fabric of Gilson's argument is but a house of cards. McInerny argues: "The point I am laboring is the obvious one that the whole structure of Metaphysics is ordered to knowledge of the divine." (p. 244) This, of course, requires a substantive architectonic to the structure of both Aristotle's Metaphysics and Aquinas's elaborate Commentary. It follows, therefore, that the genetic analysis of Aristotle's Metaphysics proposed by Jaeger and what became so influential in the first half of the twentieth century is misguided.

In considering the various accounts of Thomas's work, one might recall Kerr's claim that the "reception of Thomas Aquinas's work has been contentious from the beginning …" This suggests a bit of patience in dealing with different perspectives on reading Aquinas. Thomas O'Meara argued recently that "There has never been one Thomism," and Alasdair MacIntyre posed the query that maybe there are "too many Thomisms." Of course, it does not follow that any interpretation of Aquinas is equal to any other account. But it is here that a rational argument about the texts is a necessary condition for sorting out the issues of philosophical interpretation.

Simon Tugwell, with the theological principles of Gauthier in mind, provides probably the best succinct analysis of the complex issues regarding Aquinas as a philosopher, a theologian, or a hybrid intellectual; it is worth reading at the end of a review such as this one:

Gauthier argues that Thomas' concern was always theological, even in his "philosophical" writings, but his critics have pointed plausibly enough to signs that Thomas did have a serious philosophical purpose and that he was interested in clarifying Aristotelian philosophy in its own right. Probably there is no real contradiction between the two positions. As we have seen, Thomas' own theology drove him to recognize the importance of philosophy as a distinct discipline, if only because philosophical errors that might threaten faith need to be tackled philosophically. But his philosophical interests were not just apologetic. He was surely sincere in believing that the theological attempt to understand faith is essentially at one with the universal human attempt to understand reality. In his last years, as we have noted, the philosophers seem to have been more enthusiastic about Thomas than many of his fellow theologians were; it is quite likely that he in return found the philosophers more congenial than some of the theologians. He believed that the best way to discover the truth is to have a good argument, and in this he was being true to the tradition of Albert and indeed St. Dominic. (Tugwell, Albert and Thomas, 1988, pp. 257-258)

What is important in this monograph is the philosophical approach and the argument that McInerny offers for his readers' consideration in the second part of his book. His conclusion -- there are rationally derived philosophical propositions that also serve as statements propaedeutic to theological discussions -- is less important to this reviewer than the attempt to make cogent sense of Aquinas's elaborate Commentary on Aristotle's Metaphysics. The first section of this book will appeal to medievalists trying to get a handle on reading Aquinas's texts given the fulsome interpretations alive in the Thomist marketplace today, while philosophers interested in Aristotle's realist ontology exemplified in the Metaphysics will profit from the second part. As always, Professor McInerny's breadth of philosophical interests appeals to a rather large swath of philosophers, and this latest book is no exception.