Pragmatic Encounters

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Richard J. Bernstein, Pragmatic Encounters, Routledge, 2016, 234pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781848935157.

Reviewed by Georgia Warnke, University of California, Riverside


This book offers a selection of the papers that Richard J. Bernstein has written or given over the past 10 years or so. Together they offer an appealing picture of what he calls his "engaged fallibilistic pluralism," a pluralism that stems from the American pragmatists and is enriched by "encounters" with, among others, Arendt, Gadamer, Habermas, Rorty and Taylor. In the second essay, Bernstein lays out what he finds so attractive about pragmatism. First is its anti-foundationalism. The pragmatists reject the idea of absolute foundations not in favor of relativism but in favor of a conception of inquiry as a self-correcting enterprise. Second, pragmatism maintains that all validity claims are fallible, that we can never know anything with an unquestionable certainty. Third, in line with their view of inquiry as a self-correcting enterprise, the pragmatists emphasize the community of inquirers and the sociality of practices. Fourth, they emphasize pluralism, not only the pluralistic empiricism of William James that James calls a turbid, muddled gothic sort of affair without a sweeping outline and with little pictorial nobility" (34), but also a cultural pluralism of different ethnicities, religions and so on. Fifth is the idea that knowing is an activity -- hence, Dewey's stress on the experimental spirit. Finally, Bernstein looks to pragmatism for a vision of democracy as a way of life by which, quoting Dewey, he means "a working faith in the possibilities of human nature" that must be "put in force in the attitudes which human beings display to one another in all the incidents and relations of daily life" (35).

We might lay out Bernstein's engaged fallibilistic pluralism along six related themes, beginning with what he means by engaged fallibilism. If, following the pragmatist tradition, fallibilism is the acknowledgement that we can always be wrong about any particular belief, Bernstein's engaged fallibilism involves an openness to the beliefs of others. Indeed, he sees fallibilism not only as a claim about knowledge but also as a mentality,

a cultivated disposition to be open to other points of view, to have the imagination to transpose ourselves into understanding persons and ideas that are radically different from ours, and to have the courage and humility to enlarge our horizons in light of new evidence and new encounters with others. (33)

Openness is difficult and fragile because it requires walking a line between two possible hazards: either assuming that we can translate what others say into terms consistent with what we already think or dismissing what they say as too far removed from what we think to be plausible or possible. Instead, Bernstein asks us to "engage critically with what is really different . . . and attempt honestly to further the task of critically understanding what is other than us without denying or distorting its 'otherness'" (73).

The second theme running through Pragmatic Encounters is that of democratic pluralism. In "Cultural Pluralism" Bernstein considers the American cultural pluralists writing in the first decades of the twentieth century. Among these Bernstein includes Horace Kallen, and Alain Locke, both students of James, as well as Randolph Bourne and W.E.B. Du Bois. All eschewed the idea of the United States as a melting pot and, in various ways, with various metaphors, looked to a harmony of different voices. While pointing out that most cultural pluralists, with the exception of Du Bois and Locke, emphasized the contributions of immigrants from Eastern and Southern Europe and ignored African Americans, Bernstein takes the point that a democratic society "becomes more vigorous and robust when it benefits from the contributions of different cultural, ethnic, religious and racial groups -- groups that can take pride in their distinctive cultural achievements, and also share common values" (85).

For Bernstein, pluralism also signals the recognition that reasonable people can disagree about fundamental issues and that this disagreement can go beyond issues to vocabularies and world-views. He thinks Rorty goes too far in insisting on an insurmountable incommensurability among different vocabularies. Vocabularies, horizons, world-views and languages are not monads. Rather, appealing to Gadamer, Bernstein points out that every language is able to go beyond what it has thus far been able to say to understand and express the thoughts and insights of others. Pluralism thus incorporates the possibility not only of harmony but also of reasonable and civil disagreement. "Becoming a people," he writes, "does not require unanimity or homogeneity, but rather the possibility of agreement, an agreement that results from the agonistic conflict of opinions among a plurality of human beings" (195).

The third theme follows from the first two: the importance to democracy of dialogue and debate. Bernstein is aware of the ways in which dialogue can be used to gain political advantage or to delay action. Nonetheless, he sees a democratic society as one that guarantees the public freedom for the mutual exchange of ideas. This exchange need not limit itself to the exchange of reasons, a view Bernstein attributes to Habermas, nor, however, need it be considered a mere exchange of random opinions, a view to which he thinks Arendt is sometimes prone. In democratic societies, we justify our political and moral convictions to one another, open to the recognition that we could be mistaken. An engaged fallibilistic pluralist, then,

will always try to show -- by argument, by appealing to lived experience, by telling stories and constructing narratives -- why the alternative he favors is more attractive, more adequate, richer, more illuminating than those that he rejects. But he also acknowledges his own fallibility and recognizes that reasonable people can disagree. Meaningful disagreement is what keeps dialogue and conversation alive. (97)

The fourth theme is already implicit in the first three: a vision of, or at least hope for, a pluralist and cosmopolitan democracy enriched by difference and committed to public freedom at its core. This vision comes out of Arendt's idea of public freedom as "a positive achievement of individuals acting together" (104) and Dewey's commitment to "a democracy in which all share and all participate" (106). Bernstein maintains that the vision requires revitalizing public life and a critical public but he also holds onto the vision in what he repeatedly calls 'dark times.' "Even in the darkest of times," he claims, "there are glimpses of illumination" (111). This thought reflects the value of Marcuse's work for him. Marcuse, he says, "consistently combines a penetrating understanding of everything that seems to be going wrong in contemporary society . . . with a persistent and courageous search for what might still resist and oppose this 'bad facticity'" (137).

As Bernstein sees it, democracy is an on-going task rather than simply a set of institutions and this is the fifth theme that emerges from his essays -- the necessity of working to overcome divisions or at least to talk civilly to one another, to open up spaces of public freedom and to revitalize a public sphere of discussion and debate. Much of the task here involves refusing either/or alternatives. Faced with a choice between universalism or relativism, Bernstein asks us to think of moral and political justification in a new way -- in terms of practices of justification in which we reason together, tell stories, and move back and forth between common and diverse beliefs and commitments. Faced with a choice between incommensurability or a single framework, Bernstein asks us to engage in the hard work of trying to understand one another. He does not think philosophizing can substitute for this work. Philosophy can show us what civilized discussion looks like and it can help provide options other than false dichotomies. But it cannot substitute for practice.

The sixth and last theme is less a theme than a philosophical ethos: one poised to find common ground. Bernstein is interested less in what separates various thinkers than in what unites them. "I am aware of the many important differences between Habermas, Arendt and Dewey," he writes, "Nevertheless, I think that concerning what I have called the normative core of the idea of the public, publicity and public opinion, their different approaches complement each other" (122). He says much the same about Dewey and Arendt with regard to democracy, Habermas and Dewey with regard to pragmatism, Carl Schmitt and Simon Critchley with regard to political theology and Benjamin, Arendt, Butler, Critchley and Fanon with regard to the issue of justifying violence. Moreover, Bernstein is always concerned to find his own common ground with the thinkers he "encounters." His interest is in discovering what we can take away from a thinker rather than locating where he or she might have failed. A few characteristic statements: "Hannah Arendt has been criticized for the claims she makes . . . But I believe that she captures something vital about the spirit of the American Revolution that we are in danger of forgetting" (104). "Rorty is at his best when he seeks to keep alive a spirit of genuine openness in philosophy to new ways of speaking, thinking and acting. And I believe that this is his true legacy (48). "We cannot turn to Dewey to solve our current problems. But I believe that he can serve as a source of inspiration (5). "Although I have been critical of the way in which Habermas makes and applies this distinction between ethics and morality, I do think he draws our attention to an important difference that needs to be recognized" (177). Finally, what Bernstein says about Taylor might also be said about Bernstein himself: "When one disagrees with him then one should argue with him in the same generous hermeneutical spirit that [he] exemplifies and practices (98). Pragmatic Encounters is a generous book and a pleasure to read.