Pragmatic Encroachment in Epistemology

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Brian Kim and Matthew McGrath (eds.), Pragmatic Encroachment in Epistemology, Routledge, 2019, 215pp., $114.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138051829.

Reviewed by Peter Baumann, Swarthmore College


According to a traditional view, whether a subject is in an epistemic state like knowledge (justified belief, etc.) depends only on epistemic, truth-related factors like reliability or evidence. According to a relatively recent view, the pragmatic encroachment view, this also depends on non-epistemic, pragmatic factors like what is practically at stake for the subject. If nothing much depends on it for me, I might know that these are not peanuts on my plate; but I might not know this if my health depends on it. This anthology contains new essays on pragmatic encroachment and makes a very good and welcome contribution to current debates.

The very informative and substantial introduction by Brian Kim and Matthew McGrath is followed by Dorit Ganson's excellent "Great Expectations: Belief and the Case for Pragmatic Encroachment" which focuses on the relation between outright belief and degrees of belief. She concedes that there are robust relations between the two (e.g., in folk-psychological explanations) but explains very clearly why one cannot reduce outright belief to degrees of belief surpassing a certain threshold. The objections against reduction are debatable but also very serious. Ganson's own positive view, the "Hybrid Doxastic Pragmatism", combines aspects of the reductive threshold view and a dispositional view of belief:

"Bp requires that you are confident enough that p

  • for you to be able to have the spectrum of dispositions typical for outright belief that p under these conditions
  • for p to be able to serve as a motivating reason for you to have or engage in the relevant sorts of activities, actions, reactions, feelings, habits typical for belief that p here." (23)

This is not a reductive view because it only formulates a necessary condition for belief. It invites the claim of pragmatic encroachment insofar as the required confidence levels vary with pragmatic factors. Given that knowledge requires belief, one can then also make the case for pragmatic encroachment for knowledge. Skeptics might still disbelieve that outright belief can vary with pragmatic factors but Ganson's proposal has to be taken very seriously.

Brad Armendt's crisp, clear and original "Deliberation and Pragmatic Belief" uses the story "Death in Damascus" to discuss whether beliefs (categorical as well as graded) are sometimes stakes-sensitive. The deliberation dynamics in this story are such that the subject evaluating the options (going to Aleppo over staying in Damascus) acquires a belief about what she will do (go to Aleppo, trying to escape death) which changes the evaluation of the options, again, given that Death is a very good predictor, which evaluation then also affects her belief about where she will go. Armendt concludes that views on deliberation dynamics are compatible with the idea of belief's stakes-sensitivity.

Kate Nolfi's interesting and somewhat heterodox "Another Kind of Pragmatic Encroachment" defends an "action-oriented" approach according to which the proper function of beliefs is that of maps for successful action. The norms for belief are not only epistemic ones but also non-epistemic ones Nolfi's "weight-shifting pragmatic encroachment" (WSPE) comes to this: Whether and to what degree some belief has some epistemic status (as justified belief or as knowledge) and whether and to what degree its basis or supporting reasons confer that status to it also depends on whether it meets the norm of successful action across a wide range of subjects, circumstances and goals. Sometimes false beliefs are better suited for successful action, and systematic but moderate distortion of the truth suits our ends better in general. Hence, one can have justified but distorted and false beliefs; and even knowledge can be false (52, fn.16). This latter implication is not defended here but would deserve some detailed defense, given that this claim is as important as implausible to many.

Nolfi thinks that her view does not suffer (like ordinary forms of pragmatic encroachment views) from the implausibility of the claim that epistemic status can vary with the subject's stakes because her view doesn't concern particular beliefs but rather general types of beliefs, circumstances and ends. One might wonder, however, whether we can say anything interesting about norms for belief at this level of generality. And what if an optimistic bias (40-41) contributes to success in action in general but in a particular case it contributes to failure? Is the subject then still justified and in the know that she will succeed? Finally, we should also scrutinize our goals and ends rationally; some goals are and some aren't worth pursuing (which does not itself seem to be subject to pragmatic encroachment). Would Nolfi want to claim that only acceptable goals can encroach pragmatically on epistemic states?

Anne Baril's very clearly written "Pragmatic Encroachment and Practical Reasons" addresses an important but neglected topic. Discussing the bi-conditional claim that one knows that p iff one may treat p as a reason for action, she argues, convincingly, for the not very widely shared view that it makes a difference to the view and its verdicts about cases whether one takes practical reasons as reflecting the subject's (true or false) beliefs about the circumstances of action or rather what these circumstances really are. Cases of ignorance of high stakes bring out the divergence between the two options. Baril's main point is that it matters for the view whether one thinks of reasons as internal or external ones; again, she uses cases in defense of this claim (she herself prefers externalism). This paper makes a particularly welcome and important addition to current debates on the topic.

Brian Kim's interesting "An Externalist Decision Theory for a Pragmatic Epistemology" presents a "Gettier challenge" for pragmatic encroachers. A gettiered subject doesn't know that p but can appropriately use p as a reason for deliberation and action. Hence, it is not true that one can only do the latter if one knows p. One possible reply to Kim would be to restrict (as some do) pragmatic encroachment to the claim that being able to use p as a reason is necessary though not sufficient for knowledge that p. Kim briefly considers another reply: that in Gettier cases p can also not be used as a reason. He objects with good reasons that this doesn't explain why this is so in such cases (70-71). Kim puts more weight on two other problems. First, when a subject is gettiered, then their practical situation is irrelevant to epistemic evaluations (71). However, it is not completely clear why this should be a problem; the encroacher may only claim that it is not only practical factors that are relevant to epistemic evaluation. Second, knowledge excludes epistemic luck (of a certain kind) and thus requires an element of externalism; encroachers working with internalist conceptions of reasons for actions won't get far here (72). Kim is moving very quickly here and not everyone will be able to follow him.

Kim proposes a view that helps the encroacher deal with the above problems: an "externalist" decision theory. A categorical belief is pragmatically warranted just in case in an "objectively framed decision problem" (which takes objectively relevant possibilities into account) that belief supports the same act as expected utility considerations and the subject possesses evidence favoring p over not-p (83). Kim argues that a gettiered subject would have no evidence from the relevant objective viewpoint and would thus have no knowledge (85). However, if the reason why a subject gettiered about p cannot have evidence for p is that in such a case Gettier possibilities would be actual and thus undermine the subject's claims to evidence and knowledge, then the argument presented is weaker than it ought to be. One also wonders whether Kim would have to claim to have solved Gettier's original problem itself. In any case, it would be great to spell out a bit more in detail how Kim's notion of pragmatic warrant can solve the initial Gettier challenge. However, since Kim is giving a very big picture here (see 70), this might rather be a task for a different occasion.

Stewart Cohen's "Pragmatic Encroachment and Having Reasons" is a short but very rich contribution on the counter-intuitive claim that knowledge comes and goes with changes in the subject's practical situation. Cohen discusses an argument à la Fantl and McGrath (102). Roughly: If p (the ice on the lake will hold me) is a sufficient reason to X (cross) (an uncontroversial assumption), and if I know p, then p is a good enough reason I have to X (cross) (and it is thus rational for me to X); thus, whether I know depends on my practical situation (requires that I have good enough reason to X). Cohen's ingenuous counter-move (103-104) starts with an epistemic analogue where "doing X" is replaced by "believing q": My evidence e might probabilify p enough to turn it into knowledge, and p might probabilify q enough to qualify as a good enough reason for it, but e might still (because of the possible accumulation of risk) not probabilify q enough to make it a good enough reason I have to believe q. This suggests RPF: One can know p and p can be a reason to X but one can still fail to have p as a reason to X (104). Cohen uses RPF to block Fantl and McGrath's inference. One question remains: Is there really enough of an analogy between the epistemic and the practical case? The relation between my evidence e and p can be understood as one of probabilistic evidential support but the relations between e and Xing or between p and Xing aren't relations of probabilistic evidential support. So, does RPF really apply in the knowledge-action cases? If yes, how?

Charity Anderson and John Hawthorne's "Pragmatic Encroachment and Closure" also combines brevity with high quality. It discusses another neglected topic: whether encroachment and (single-premise) closure are compatible with each other. They first discuss a version of the encroachment view according to which knowledge that p requires practical adequacy concerning p (where there is no gap between one's preferences, given p, and one's preferences as based on expected utilities). They present 3 cases where there is practical adequacy concerning some proposition but not concerning a proposition deducible by it. Thus, the latter could not be known while the former could be known; this violates the closure principle. The authors make the same kind of point, presenting 3 more cases, for the practical stakes-version of encroachment: some low stakes propositions entail high stakes propositions. Given the plausibility of epistemic closure, all this creates serious problems for encroachers.

Mikkel Gerken's "Pragmatic Encroachment on Scientific Knowledge?" argues that encroachment is as implausible in the case of scientific knowledge as in the case of ordinary knowledge (or even more so). Neither the variation of the stakes for individual scientists nor the variation in the public's stakes should make a difference to scientific knowledge (section 4). Gerken also holds (124) that it is implausible to accept that a scientist in a low stakes situation could know that p while an ordinary person in a high stakes situation could fail to know that p, even if they share the same evidence. Isn't scientific knowledge more demanding and harder to get than ordinary knowledge (120)? However, one could reply that this need not always be true but only in general. One related question is whether the epistemic standards in science might be so demanding that they are good enough for all (or almost all) practical purposes. Gerken also argues that we don't appeal to practical factors as reasons to accept knowledge attributions -- which we could do if the encroachment view were true (125-127). He concludes with the argument that even though scientific realism is in tension with pragmatic encroachment views, it also doesn't help encroachers to embrace anti-realism.

N. Ángel Pinillos' "Skepticism and Evolution" aims at explaining the appeal of epistemic skepticism. He does not discuss pragmatic encroachment (see 165, fn.7, and 146) but his view involves a knowledge-action principle according to which knowledge and actionability typically go hand in hand. Pinillos argues that there is a "skeptical mechanism" (SM) which checks for a given belief whether the subject can rule out alternative possibilities; if the result is negative, then it delivers the verdict of ignorance (lack of knowledge) and recommends that one shouldn't act on that belief. Pinillos argues further that this mechanism has evolved because of its specific adaptive advantage of risk avoidance. One might wonder why, if the risk to be avoided is acting on false beliefs, one needs a knowledge principle for actionability rather than, say, a truth principle. It is also worth stressing that Pinillos focuses on third-person cases; in first-person cases expected utility considerations might rather seem more relevant than checking for knowledge. Pinillos ends with a debunking argument against epistemic skepticism. The basic idea is that when applied to skeptical scenarios SM is used "far outside its natural design conditions" (163); we thus lack justification to believe skeptical premises (like "I don't know I'm not subject to massive deception"), and the skeptical argument loses its force. However, one might doubt whether philosophers use SM when thinking about skepticism (Pinillos seems to touch on this worry briefly on 163 and 164). As Pinillos himself admits, a lot of what he is saying is speculative. The relevant empirical questions are still quite open.

Rima Basu and Mark Schroeder's very engaging and original "Doxastic Wronging" defends the idea that one can morally wrong others by believing certain things about them. They discuss two serious problems or puzzles for their view. First, it seems that belief is not under our control (185-194). Crucial to the authors' rebuttal appear to be two points they're making. First, even given the evidence, one might just not care and end up without a belief on the subject matter (192-193). Or one might avoid a specific view by applying very high standards of evidence for it (194). However, doesn't this only show that one can suspend judgment (which might also be morally problematic) but not that one can control what one believes if one does believe something about the subject matter?

The second problem concerns the apparent lack of coordination between epistemic requirements and moral requirements on belief (194-201). The authors deny that there could be something morally but not epistemically forbidden (197-199). In order to support this claim, they propose that there can be moral encroachment on epistemic rationality (and presumably also on knowledge): The threshold for sufficient evidence varies with moral factors (201). I have two worries about this. First, that there are no morally impermissible but epistemically permissible beliefs (202) only follows if the bar for evidence in every case is not merely being pushed up somewhat but rather being pushed up so high that everything morally impermissible would also be epistemically impermissible; however, there seems no guarantee for this (the brief passage on privacy rights against knowledge (202-203) does not help much here). Second, the authors end by supporting the claim of moral encroachment by invoking the phenomenon of doxastic wronging. (203). In order to avoid the charge of circularity (that there is doxastic wronging has crucial support in the claim of moral encroachment), Basu and Schroeder could, perhaps, argue that they are only trying to offer an internally coherent picture of doxastic wronging.

Juan Comesaña's brief but very substantial "A Note on Knowledge-First Decision Theory and Practical Adequacy" discusses the combination of the view that one's knowledge is one's evidence with the expected utility view. Assuming that what one knows need not be entailed by one's evidence, this combination suggests that when thinking about how to act one should disregard certain possibilities one knows not to obtain while expected utility considerations alone would not discard them. The combination view gives the wrong verdict in such cases. Comesaña shows that adding a condition of practical adequacy for knowledge (no gap between one's preferences conditional on p and one's expected utilities) fixes this problem (209-210).

This is a very welcome anthology with some excellent contributions. It has a good focus (neither too much spread nor too much overlap of topics). Everyone working on pragmatic encroachment or related topics will certainly want to read it.