Pragmatic Encroachment, Religious Belief, and Practice

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Aaron Rizzieri, Pragmatic Encroachment, Religious Belief, and Practice, Palgrave MacMillan, 2013, 167pp, $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137009401.

Reviewed by Justin P. McBrayer, Fort Lewis College


Suppose you and your spouse pack up the car and leave for a vacation. On your way out of the driveway, you have the following conversation:

Spouse: Did you remember to turn the stove off after breakfast?

You: Yes.

Spouse: You know you forgot to turn it off the other day. If we leave it on over our vacation, our house will burn down.

You: You’re right. I’d better go back and check.

Epistemically speaking, what happened in this scenario? One plausible analysis is as follows. Under ordinary circumstances, you know claims like ‘my stove is turned off’. But it would make little sense to go back to the house to verify something that you already knew to be the case, and so in cases like this where the cost of being mistaken rises significantly, your knowledge is lost. This, in a nutshell, is the claimed insight of pragmatic encroachment.

‘Pragmatic encroachment’ denotes a range of views united in claiming that the conditions under which true belief counts as knowledge include at least some pragmatic conditions. In other words, practical considerations are “encroaching” upon the territory traditionally occupied by truth-directed conditions on knowledge. What you know or are justified in believing may depend on the existential import of such beliefs.

Aaron Rizzieri surveys the burgeoning literature on pragmatic encroachment and applies some of its lessons to religious epistemology.[1] The overall message of the book is that everyone -- theists and non-theists alike -- should grant the less than ideal epistemic foundations supporting religious or irreligious beliefs. And since high-stakes beliefs like religious beliefs raise the epistemic bar, we should refrain from acting on these religious or irreligious beliefs until the epistemic foundation is more secure (154).

The book consists of six short chapters written in a contemporary analytic style (e.g., the use of acronyms like the KA principle, analyses like ‘s knows that p iff . . . ’, etc.). The first chapter is a survey of the contemporary encroachment literature. Rizzieri presents paradigm case pairs like the stove case in which we seem to know something at first and then lack knowledge after the stakes are raised (e.g., the famous bank cases). He then compares various solutions to the cases. How might we explain why knowledge is lost in high-stakes cases? There are three main competing solutions.

Strict Invariantist theories insist that the level of epistemic support required for knowledge remains constant across all levels of stakes. They either have to say that we don’t know in both cases (which seems to imply a widespread skepticism) or that we do know in both cases (which doesn’t match the intuitions of many people) or that there is a non-ad hoc and yet non-pragmatic difference between the two cases (which is difficult to identify).

It is important to distinguish the next two solutions from one another. Contextualist theories insist that the word ‘know’ is like an indexical whose content varies across contexts. Contextualists solve the paradigm cases by noting that our sentences about whether the people in the scenarios know anything will express different propositions in different contexts and further that these different propositions have different truth conditions because they express different properties all covered by the single English word ‘knows’. So it’s not that context affects what it takes to know; rather, it’s that context affects which concept of knowledge is in play.

Encroachment theories, on the other hand, accept that the meaning of ‘know’ is univocal. They solve the paradigm cases by granting what seems intuitive to many: you knew something at first and then later lost your knowledge when the stakes were raised. Hence, practical factors affect the level of support required for knowledge. There are various species of this reply in the literature, and Rizzieri cites the knowledge-action principle from Jeremy Fantl and Matthew McGrath as a persuasive example:

KA: S knows that p only if S is rational to act as if p.[2]

The KA principle explains the paradigm cases. When the stakes are raised it is no longer rational to act as if the stove is turned off, and together with KA, this implies that when the stakes are raised you don’t know that the stove is turned off.

Chapter two applies the lessons of pragmatic encroachment to arguments against the reasonable belief in miracles. The occurrence of a genuine miracle would be an important insight into the world. Finding out whether there are real miracles is a high-stakes situation -- it would be costly to get it wrong. But if the lesson from encroachment is that we need more evidence in cases where the stakes are high, perhaps this lesson can be used as a premise in a new, non-Humean argument against the reasonability of belief in miracles: miraculous events carry deep existential import. Ceteris paribus, propositions that carry deep existential import require more evidence to be reasonable to believe than do ordinary claims. Therefore, propositions about miracles require more evidence to be reasonable to believe than do ordinary claims.

Rizzieri objects that this argument is unsound because its major premise is false. High stakes raise the bar on justification only when believing the proposition on the basis of normal evidence is risky. And in the miracles case, this necessary condition is not met. If anything, it is risky to fail to believe in the miraculous. In fact, he thinks the argument can be turned on its head: as long as one deeply hopes that the miraculous event has occurred, encroachment seems to imply that one needs rather more evidence than usual to force a revision in one’s noetic structure. In other words, “stakes considerations can raise the bar for justification that the denial of what one hopes for is true” (55). This chapter raises a number of interesting questions that I merely note here. First, are stakes raised by internal features or external ones? If I merely hope that x is true, does that raise the stakes for me even though -- as a matter of fact -- nothing hangs on x? Second, is it true that what we believe, religiously speaking, is connected to goods and harms in the way Pascal and others suggest? If not, the encroachment issue will never arise for issues like miracles. Third, what happens if a subject can see that what we believe, religiously speaking, is connected to goods and harms but cannot determine which religious belief is most appropriate?[3] This seems to be the issue in the “many gods” objection to Pascal’s wager, and it might be enough to derail Rizzieri’s project.

Chapter three presents and defends an argument for an access internalist understanding of epistemic justification. According to access internalist theories, if you are justified in holding a particular belief, you should normally be able to reflect on that belief and identify the justifying factor(s). Rizzieri thinks that taking encroachment seriously requires us to understand justification in this sort of way. He calls his argument the Encroachment Argument For Internalism (EAFI), and a simplified version is as follows:

1. There is a link between being justified in believing that p and being morally or prudentially criticizable for acting as if p.

2. This is true only if people can normally be aware both of the grounds that justify the belief that p and the efficacy of those grounds.

3. Therefore, we can normally be aware both of the grounds that justify our beliefs and the efficacy of those grounds. (62)

The gist is that our conventions for offering moral and prudential praise and blame include necessary, epistemic conditions. When we evaluate the actions of others, we do so from their epistemic perspective. If it wasn’t reasonable for you to believe that starting your car would trigger a bomb, we won’t hold you morally responsible for the consequence. But, and this is the point of premise 2, this practice makes no sense on externalist understandings of justification. Of course, externalists about justification might suggest that this argument misses the point. They might grant that there are internalist components to justification or internalist conceptions of justification. But they will insist that while these concepts might play a role in moral responsibility, they are irrelevant for warrant or knowledge.

Chapter four argues that the level of justification required for action-guiding beliefs is more robust than the thin conceptions of justification offered by dogmatists (and phenomenal conservatives?) on the one hand and reformed epistemologists on the other. The EAFI argument (above) secures a strongly internalist sense of justification: Plantinga and others cannot defend the justification of religious beliefs on merely externalist grounds.[4] However, the lesson from encroachment is that a belief is epistemically justified for one only if one is morally or prudentially justified in acting on that belief. And -- in high stakes scenarios -- we normally agree the mere fact that something seems true or is the deliverance of the sensus divinitatus or whatever is insufficient to morally or prudentially justify one in acting on the belief. And so in high stakes scenarios, this is insufficient to justify the belief as well. Again, encroachment serves as a bridge principle linking the justification of propositions to the justification of acting.

So what would count as a sufficiently robust and yet internalist justification for acting in high-stakes considerations? Chapter five sketches Rizzieri’s positive account of the justification of action-guiding beliefs. Unfortunately, he declines to offer a full analysis, settling for a defense of three necessary conditions:

S is justified in believing an action-guiding belief that p on the basis of a method of belief-formation b in circumstance c only if:

(a) s’s use of b in c allows s to reliably detect how the world appears or evidential and logical relationships between p and s’s beliefs which are relevant to the truth of p,

(b) s’s overall evidence (including experiences) sufficiently support p, and

(c) s has a sufficiently high level of confidence in the deliverances of b which is grounded in s’s past experience of b’s at least apparent reliability. (114)

In short, an action-guiding belief will be justified only when it is reliably produced, strongly supported by and based on the overall evidence and results from a system of belief formation in which the subject has historically-based confidence.

There is much to complain about in this view of justification. I will raise two objections. First, if encroachment shows that the relevant sense of justification for action-guiding beliefs is strongly access internalist, how can the correct analysis of justification have a reliability requirement as in clause (a)? Rizzieri is careful to note that condition (a) merely requires the ability to reliably detect features of one’s experience that represent the world rather than the ability to reliably detect features of the external world itself (116), but this isn’t enough to avoid the problem. What should we say about the person who thinks that he can reliably detect the features of his experience even though he cannot actually do so? If it seems to someone that she is reliable at detecting the features of her experience and if she has no reason to think that she cannot do so, it seems as though her beliefs can still be justified. Whether she is actually reliable in doing so is an externalist commitment the access internalist should avoid.

Second, condition (c) appears to start a regress. In order to be justified, a subject must have high confidence in the reliability of her belief-forming method. But, of course, this confidence is the result of testing the method against the deliverances of other belief-forming methods. For example, one might test the reliability of a new scientific apparatus against the deliverances of vision (118). Rizzieri is aware of the risk posed by requiring any kind of access conditions on justification. He cites Michael Bergmann’s dilemma for internalism as an illustration of this worry.[5] The solution, according to Rizzieri, is to restrict the scope of beliefs for which one needs to have access to the content and efficacy of the grounds to action-guiding beliefs and not beliefs simpliciter. And so (magically) while we have to have access to both the content and the efficacy of the grounds in order to be justified in believing that my car is in the parking lot, we do not have to have access to either in order to be justified in believing that vision is reliable or that I have a good memory or that the world appears to me in a certain way (126-9).

Since the distinction between action-guiding beliefs and non-action-guiding beliefs is crucial to stopping the regress, Rizzieri needs a plausible and non-ad hoc way of drawing the line between the two. I doubt there is one. Rizzieri offers the example of Clifford’s reckless sea captain who sets sail without inspecting his ship. He says that the relevant action-guiding belief in this case is the captain’s belief ‘the ship is seaworthy’ (124). While I don’t doubt that this belief plays a role in explaining the captain’s behavior, the same could be said for any number of his beliefs. Suppose I walk to the fridge for a beer. What was the action-guiding belief in this case? No doubt my belief that there is beer in the fridge played a role. But so did my belief that I could walk, that the floor would hold me up, that my memory of where I placed the beer was reliable and so on. Counterfactually, all of these beliefs are tied to my action: in the closest world in which I lacked any of these beliefs, I would not have acted in the same way.

Chapter six, the final chapter, has two goals. First, Rizzieri defends the view that a proposition is a reason for action only when the proposition in question is known. This common-sense principle has been rejected by philosophers like William James who think that in at least some cases unknown propositions can still functions as reasons for action. Second, Rizzieri suggests that in religious scenarios, mental states like hope are often epistemically, morally, and prudentially preferable wellsprings of action than belief.  James is broadly understood to have defended religious courses of action even in the absence of the relevant evidence or justification for the religious claims in question. James inspires us to act without evidence in cases where there are live options open to us that cannot be closed by the available evidence. Famously, God’s existence is such a case. Against this, Rizzieri complains that James misunderstands belief and that he misunderstands the options available to a religious believer. It is the latter point that is most important. Since James understands the practical consequences for an agnostic and an atheist to be identical, he assumes that we are in a forced choice with high stakes: we either believe in God or we do not, and the consequences for all non-believers are the same (144). Rizzieri argues that many (most?) of the goods available to the theist are available to the agnostic as well, as long as the agnostic operates from a mindset of hope. If that’s true, then the high-stakes dilemma is lost.

Though the highly specialized terminology and assumed background render the book inaccessible to a general audience, the book offers a first pass on the implications of pragmatic encroachment for religious thinking that professionals in analytic philosophy will appreciate. 

[1] This is an instance of a more general interest in the application of contemporary epistemology to long-standing issues in philosophy of religion. For example, see the recent Templeton project on New Insights and Directions for Religious Epistemology led by John Hawthorne.

[2] Jeremy Fantl and Matthew McGrath. 2007. “On Pragmatic Encroachment in Epistemology.” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 75(3): 558-88.

[3] Thanks to Caleb Ontiveros for raising this third point.

[4] For example, see Alvin Plantinga. 2000. Warranted Christian Belief (Oxford University Press).

[5] Michael Bergmann. 2006. Justification without Awareness (Oxford University Press).