Pragmatism: An Introduction

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Michael Bacon, Pragmatism: An Introduction, Polity Press, 2012, 224pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745646657.

Reviewed by Colin Koopman, University of Oregon


The most important claim in this book is that "pragmatism is best viewed not as a set of doctrines but rather as a tradition of thought" (2). I take it that Michael Bacon intends this in the sense expressed by Alasdair MacIntyre's conception of a tradition as "an argument extended through time in which certain fundamental agreements are defined and redefined."[1]According to Bacon, "Despite family resemblances among those who are labeled pragmatists, there have always been sharp -- sometimes irreconcilable -- differences within this tradition" (2). In exploring how these differences really do make a difference, we can come to terms with the wisdom that the differences within pragmatism not only are, but also really ought to be, the vital heart of pragmatism itself, at least on pragmatism's own grounds. Bacon thus helps the reader understand why pragmatism's internal debates should lead us to regard this tradition not as divided so much as multiplied. This is a crucial thought in the context of the contemporary state of pragmatist philosophy, as I shall discuss below.

Bacon's Pragmatism is, as its subtitle claims, most certainly a helpful introductory text for newcomers who are curious about, or perhaps enrolled in a class on, pragmatism. It is also a valuable introduction to a broader view of the pragmatist tradition for scholars who now face a list of publications that has been steadily growing over the past few decades. I shall first discuss the merits of the book for the classroom (noting along the way a few reservations that some readers are likely to have), and then move on to a more pointed discussion of why it ought to be required reading for the rest of us insofar as we pragmatists are in the midst of our own heated debates today.

For a quick summary of the book's structure, it helps to note Bacon's explicit decision to arrange the discussion with reference to "thinkers rather than themes" (ix, note 1). Each chapter discusses the conceptions, consequences, and criticisms of a pair or trio of contemporary thinkers. After a brief introduction, Bacon discusses Charles Sanders Peirce and William James, John Dewey (this is the sole solo-author chapter), mid-to-late century analytic pragmatism (W.V.O. Quine, Wilfrid Sellars, and Donald Davidson), neopragmatism in the work of Richard Rorty and Hilary Putnam, the engagement between pragmatism and critical theory in the work of Jürgen Habermas and Richard J. Bernstein, the recent revivals of Peirce in the work of Susan Haack and Cheryl Misak, and two neo-pragmatist efforts, Robert Brandom's rationalist pragmatism and Huw Price's pragmatic naturalism.

With respect to its usefulness for students, the book will function quite well as an introductory text in both advanced undergraduate offerings on pragmatism and graduate survey courses. Instructors will, however, want their students to take careful note that Bacon's "aim is not to be exhaustive" (viii). What, then, might be thought to be missing? Bacon's treatment of the classical pragmatists details only the standard triumvirate of Peirce, James, and Dewey -- he does not mention other figures once thought to be peripheral but increasingly central to the classical canon, such as Jane Addams and W.E.B. DuBois, as well as the prime suspect whenever the triumvirate is expanded, George Herbert Mead. Among mid-century pragmatists, Bacon takes up Quine and Sellars but neglects some of their contemporaries (who Quine and Sellars themselves too often neglected), including onetime students of Dewey: Sidney Hook, John Herman Randall, Jr., and Richard McKeon (whose place in pragmatism's history as Dewey's student and an early teacher of Rorty has yet to be sufficiently explored). Many will also note the omission of C.I. Lewis from the book's main discussion. In coming toward the present, Bacon's treatment of contemporary pragmatists offers a wider range. And yet one name that might be thought by many to be obviously missing is that of Cornel West. Another might be Philip Kitcher, whose self-identifying with pragmatism has been explicit only in his very recent work (so Bacon certainly should be forgiven this omission).

Though each exception is indeed excusable as an isolated instance, the broader pattern of exceptions reveals a decided tilt in Bacon's book that might not be obvious to those new to the subject. The slant is toward pragmatist epistemology -- rather than, for instance, pragmatist democratic theory, or pragmatist moral theory, or even pragmatist metaphysics. These topics are, of course, not exclusive, especially not for a pragmatist. We have here distinctions and not dichotomies. That said, Bacon's discussions on the whole tilt toward epistemology such that, for example, his coverage of democratic theory is primarily about its epistemic variants. Some readers, I suspect, will be surprised by this given Dewey's vigorous critiques of what he once called "the epistemology industry" as well as Rorty's later, pointed, similar stance.

Having noted the book's tilt, the first thing to note is that this tilt should not be taken as a cause for dismissal. Bacon's book clearly demonstrates that there are crucial and ongoing debates within pragmatism concerning the status of epistemic concepts of truth, knowledge, and justification. An introduction to the pragmatist tradition that focuses on epistemological debates need not be discounted just because there are other debates to be had, too. In calling attention to this tilt, I do not intend to criticize it, but only to note it. I intend to note it in the same way that it would be worth pointing out to students in an introductory course who might otherwise be inclined to think that pragmatism lacks a basis for morality, aesthetics, or cultural critique. A student would be wrong to think this, but an especially skeptical student might need to be sent elsewhere to be set right on this particular point. On the points at which the book does aim, however, there is much to set the student, even the skeptical student, very right.

The book, despite its subtitle, is not only worth assigning to our students, but also should be read by those of us who assume we are already knowledgable about pragmatism. This is not because the book advances a number of important new arguments at the cutting edge of the scholarship, but rather because of its range with respect to what it introduces. The book will be valuable for anyone who considers herself a pragmatist insofar as, at least in my experience, pragmatists today tend to divide themselves into two camps that, for whatever reason, do not spend all that much time productively engaging one another. In one camp are contemporary scholars of classical pragmatism whose (often historical) interests are in featuring the riches of the classical figures on their own terms and in their own vocabulary -- this tends to leave little (not none, but little) room for many of the agenda items central in contemporary analytic philosophy (or contemporary continental philosophy, for that matter). In the other camp are contemporary analytic pragmatists who often use the classical figures for purposes that cannot be clearly located in the classical work itself and are even at times freely critical of the originating figures -- this tends to result in a neglect of that more historically-oriented contemporary scholarship that explicates the very terms in which classical pragmatisms originated. Both of these camps are decidedly pragmatist in that their work proceeds by way of engagements with the classical figures (with varying levels of detail of course), but the two camps clearly use these engagements for quite different purposes.

There are, of course, a few exceptions to this admittedly quick sketch of a self-dividing pragmatism in the present. Perhaps most notable are Richard Bernstein (see his The Pragmatic Turn) and Joseph Margolis (see Pragmatism's Advantage), both of whom engage with the historical scholarship and the contemporary problematics (in both analytic and continental philosophy).[2] But these two are, decidedly, exceptions. (If you find my portrait inaccurate, then I would add that it is probably because you do not come to the conferences -- and if you do come to the conferences and still disagree, then that is probably because you only come to half of the conferences, a fact which you may of course be unaware of, thus proving my point.)

This aspect of the state of contemporary pragmatist philosophy is most unfortunate. Facing such matters, a book like Bacon's helps us see pragmatism as multiplied rather than divided. It thus helps facilitate conversations across seeming divides. The point is not that these conversations need result in agreement -- nobody wants a grand pragmatist love-in (especially not me). The point, rather, is that such conversations might help us turn frustrated disagreements into debates that can be productive. This would be in the spirit of Bernstein's "engaged fallibilistic pluralism" which, Bacon says, "enjoins us to seek to understand each other and, in the process of so doing, criticize our own views as well as those we encounter" (137). Agreement need not be a desideratum, but a lack of engagement across disagreement is a decided failure. (Anyone who has found herself bumping up against stubborn anti-continental 'Analytic' philosophers or dismissive anti-analytic 'Continental' philosophers knows just what I mean -- and anyone who has never bumped up against both sorts of figures is quite likely doing her work in some all-too-insulated enclave.)

Bacon's book would be useful for these purposes just insofar as its best parts are its discussions of the disagreements constitutive of pragmatism as a tradition. Pragmatism's persisting disagreements show that pragmatists need not take themselves to be divided if they can first see themselves as locked into debates that would constitute pragmatism as itself a plurality, in Bernstein's sense of an engaged fallibilistic pluralism. Pragmatism as a tradition of debate, not a position of doctrine, is Bacon's best theme.

Chapter One gives the reader a good sense of the debates through which Peirce and James defined themselves and one another (40). Peirce's pragmatism, says Bacon, should be directed to making sense of science (to this I would only add the clarification that Peirce was interested above all in making sense of those experimental sciences of his day that were beginning to employ with great success ideas drawing on techniques of probability, as is ably discussed by Ian Hacking in his masterful book The Taming of Chance).[3] In contrast, Bacon points out, for James pragmatism helps us address ourselves to "matters of vital importance" that reach out of the laboratories and into the hearts of men and women out on the street. On Bacon's account this debate is internal to the very logic of anything that we might call pragmatism. If this is right, then no pragmatism alone could (or should want to) find a way to bring this argument to a conclusion. The dialectic of study and street is integral to pragmatism itself.

In later chapters, Bacon traces a range of more recent debates. At the center of each is Rorty, surely one of the most debated philosophers of our era. Bacon tracks Rorty's debates with Putnam (117), Habermas (129), Bernstein (139), Haack (157), Misak (176), Brandom (179), and Price (195). That Rorty is the central thinker in the later chapters of Bacon's narrative will come as no surprise to readers already familiar with his first book, Richard Rorty: Pragmatism and Political Liberalism (which is to my mind one of the two or three best book-length treatments of Rorty available).[4] Through these chapters we come to appreciate why Rorty's importance is due in no small part to his bright idea of holding together two trios of thinkers otherwise left disconnected, namely Quine-Sellars-Davidson and Peirce-James-Dewey. What may we make of Rorty's fusion? Does it work? What are its implications? In short, is it true? These are the questions around which the many of the debates with Rorty swirl.

Answering these questions requires that we first ask another question. What problem is Rorty's version of pragmatism a response to, anyway? That this question must come first ought to be accepted on grounds internal to pragmatism itself. Only if we have a sense of a problem, doubt, or indeterminacy can we begin to assess whether or not a proposal constitutes a working solution, a successful belief, or a determinate resolution. Bacon helps us recognize that Rorty's pragmatism, like much (not all) of the pragmatism that followed and preceded it, can be seen as contributing to one of modernity's most critical philosophical matters: normativity. Interestingly, Rorty himself did not always see his views in these exact terms, as Bacon shows in his coverage of a crucial but under-read exchange over normativity between Rorty and Bjørn Ramberg (98). But the theme of normativity, if not the word itself, is omnipresent throughout his work. Rorty late in his career finally confessed to this as his life-long obsession:

I am a hedgehog who, despite showering my reader with allusions and dropping lots of names, has really only one idea: the need to get beyond representationalism, and thus into an intellectual world in which human beings are responsible only to each other.[5]

This goes directly to the best idea in pragmatism: only where we participate with one another in shared social practices are we capable of instituting authority without collapsing into authoritarianism. If this is pragmatism's best idea, then one of the best debates in pragmatism can be seen as that over how to best construe this claim: for neopragmatists the core of shared social practice would take the form of linguistic conversation whereas for the classical pragmatists it would more often take shape as socially-mediated experience (99).

At his book's outset Bacon characterizes pragmatism as the view that philosophical questions "should be addressed by drawing upon the resources offered by our practices" (1). This amounts to the view that normativity is something that practice can generate out of itself and can generate only out of itself. One of the very best expressions of this idea from across the full sweep of over one hundred years of pragmatist philosophy is that offered by Dewey in his Logic when he poses the book's central question: "How, it will be asked, can inquiry which has to be evaluated by reference to a standard be itself the source of the standard?"[6] This is the central question of pragmatism -- and perhaps as well the central question of modernity.[7] Pragmatism's future, I submit, depends on its abilities to not only withstand but also to embrace the intense pressures of the fiery debates at the very forge of modernity itself: our wild experiment of instituting norms on the basis of nothing more and nothing less than shared traditions of practice.


My thanks to David Rondel for helpful comments on certain key formulations herein.

[1] Alasdair MacIntyre, Whose Justice? Which Rationality? (Notre Dame University Press, 1988), 12.

[2] Richard Bernstein, The Pragmatic Turn (Polity, 2010); Joseph Margolis, Pragmatism's Advantage (Stanford University Press, 2010).

[3] Ian Hacking, The Taming of Chance (Cambridge University Press, 1990).

[4] See Michael Bacon, Richard Rorty: Pragmatism and Political Liberalism (Lexington, 2007).

[5] Richard Rorty, "Philosophy as a Transitional Genre," republished in The Rorty Reader, eds. Richard Bernstein and Christopher Voparil (Wiley-Blackwell, 2010 [2004]), 474.

[6] John Dewey, Logic: The Theory of Inquiry, republished in The Later Works of John Dewey, Volume 12, ed. Jo Ann Boydston (Southern Illinois University Press, 1986 [1938]), 13.

[7] A wide number of pragmatists have been arguing in recent decades that the theme of constructing normativity out of our practices is central not only to pragmatism but also to the very project of modern philosophy itself. For a summary of the idea in Rorty's work see my explication in Colin Koopman, "Rorty's Linguistic Turn: Why (More Than) Language Matters to Philosophy," Contemporary Pragmatism 8, no. 1, June 2011: 61-84. For this idea directly in recent work see Jürgen Habermas, The Philosophical Discourse of Modernity, trans. Frederick Lawrence (MIT Press, 1987 [1985]), 7, and Robert Brandom, Reason in Philosophy (Harvard University Press, 2009), 33. For the most recent exposition of pragmatism in these terms see the fine work in Cheryl Misak, The American Pragmatists (Oxford University Press, 2013), xi.