Pragmatism and Justice

Placeholder book cover

Susan Dieleman, David Rondel, and Christopher Voparil (eds.), Pragmatism and Justice, Oxford University Press, 2017, 334pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780190459246.

Reviewed by Alan Malachowski, Stellenbosch University


This carefully assembled, well-structured, and timely collection of eighteen articles, some previously published, most not, provides a wealth of valuable insight, often from interdisciplinary perspectives, concerning how pragmatism can and should contribute to some of the central debates in modern political philosophy.

The book is ostensibly designed to fill a yawning gap in pragmatist thinking caused by an absence of substantive theorizing on the notion of justice. But, it does far more than that. In the first place, the editors’ introduction furnishes an intelligent and instructive account as to why the gap exists. And that is not, of course, simply because key figures in the pragmatist tradition said very little about justice. This is largely true, but uninteresting. It is rather that they had reasons, or at least believed they had good pragmatist reasons, for avoiding the tasks of trying to construct a theoretical account of justice or even engaging on theoretical territory with other such attempts.

Obviously, the stronger the reasons for abstention, the less motivation there was for tackling these tasks or even acknowledging the existence of a problematic ‘gap’. If the reasons were strong per se, it could be argued that where justice is concerned, theory construction is redundant, that the practical goals of such a venture can be better achieved by leaving a theoretical conception of justice itself out of the picture — the guiding thought perhaps being that social ills can best be dealt with piecemeal on the ground without ascending to the level of justice itself. We might imagine a follower of Dewey, cheered on by Rorty, making this kind of ‘redundancy’ case (“Take care of social ills and justice will take care of itself.”). And, even if these reasons fail, if they only go far enough to convince sympathetic pragmatists, at least we then have a quick explanation why thinkers such as James and Dewey made no concerted attempts to formulate a univocal theory of justice. After all, as the three editors rightly remind us, pragmatists preferred to give priority to practical problems, avoid a priori theorizing, and cater to a resolutely pluralistic take on “real-world injustices” (4).

The editors do not explicitly assume an adjudicator’s role on the question whether the motivating reasons for the ‘gap’ were sufficiently vindicatory to merit the kind of jurisdiction outside pragmatist thought that would encourage a venture very different from their own. But, the contributions they have selected make this unnecessary.

In Chapter 16, for example, Robert B. Talisse tackles the question head on. He unfolds a vigorous line of argument to the effect that even if an “exculpating explanation” of Dewey’s “inattention to justice” (283) can be found, his lack of a theory of justice is not just puzzling, but highly problematic for his whole approach to politics. Talisse also points out that this omission is even more troublesome for those “pragmatist political philosophers who follow Dewey broadly in advocating an epistemic participationist conception of democracy” (286). Not content with simply identifying the need for pragmatists to theorize justice even by their own lights, Talisse offers some preparatory but nevertheless quite clear and forthright suggestions as to how they should go about this.

Taking a different stance, Patricia Hill Collins (Chapter 8) offers a nuanced thought on dealing with the alleged ‘gap’:

Approaching a field as broad and significant as American Pragmatism by emphasizing its omissions may seem counterintuitive. Yet this process of reading the silences, excavating the subtext, and/or reading between the lines suggests that what seems to be absent is actually present. (149)

She goes on, as do the majority of her co-contributors, “to examine themes that despite their relative invisibility, have also shaped the pragmatist canon” (149).

All the chapters, collectively and for the most part individually, do much to alleviate anxiety that close attention to theoretical considerations of justice is liable to lure pragmatists off into wasteful fields of abstraction. This represents a further example of how the book delivers more than just putative ‘gap filling’ substance.

Contributors open up their discussions of justice so widely that a myriad of issues both socio-practical and theoretical become both relevant and coverable. The list is extensive, but importantly highlights, as it should, issues of race while also shading off smoothly into methodological matters that make legitimate calls on the creative deployment of theory.

Regarding racial injustice (subjected to the deepest critical focus in Chapters 8-13): in addition to inevitable engagements with well recognized but still intransigent problems of inequality, oppression, and prejudice, the authors highlight fine-grained socio-historical and experiential contexts. These reveal that such problems invite pragmatist attention because it is, or at least should be, more sensitive to the impact of contextual factors than narrower theoretical approaches. Contextual factors below the radar of conventional theories can entrench, exacerbate or even create racial problems, and need to be addressed with a close eye on the practical upshot. Shannon Sullivan (Chapter 13) raises the alarming case, too often overlooked, of the “racial battle fatigue” which is caused by the enervating and unrelenting, daily impact of prejudice and oppression, subterranean or otherwise. Racial battle fatigue has been “linked empirically to depression, tension and generalized anxiety disorder” (238). Indeed its multiple damaging effects, which Shannon rightly takes the trouble to describe in detail, mean that racism “literally get[s] inside and help[s] constitute the bodies of black people in harmful ways” (239). This clearly has significant implications for how the ‘subjects’ of a corrective theory of racial injustice should be characterized, and reveals the correlative inadequacies of the common philosophical, and not just philosophical, tendency to work with assumptions which entail that victims of such injustice are just agents bereft of certain rights and equalities of opportunity. Assumptions of this kind encourage the incremental approach to reform that pragmatism has historically tended to embrace.

A fierce objection to this incrementalism is put forward by José Medina in Chapter 11. His chief concern, reverberating throughout much of the book, is that despite its avowedly good intentions, pragmatism has tacitly and conservatively colluded with unjust social arrangements and practices while at the same time placing obstacles in the path of adequate redress. This is an important objection, and well-meaning pragmatists who are fazed by it should breathe a sigh of relief when reading that Medina wants to help them meet it.

If things get really bad, drastic action is often called for. In socio-political situations this can mean insurrection. Medina initially makes some strong points about epistemic insurrection which he argues constitutes a necessary response to the kind of entrenched ignorance which both causes and sustains racial injustice. Here, he urges, forced change has to come not just at the individual level, but also throughout institutions and social practices. When change at this second level is factored into the discussion, then full-blooded insurrection is automatically brought to the table. Medina identifies the challenge it poses for pragmatism:

In a nutshell, the insurrectionist challenge is that for pragmatism to count as a philosophy of social transformation and liberation it must create conceptual and motivational space for insurrection. (203)

The main difficulty here is that the experimentalism that has been integral to pragmatism’s philosophical identity depends on a process of instrumentalist reasoning in which consequences can be assessed, and ideally predicted, in order to motivate appropriate remedial action. But, as Medina points out, this is incompatible with “the unpredictability of radical subversion or insurrection” (204). The pith of Medina’s argument seems to be that leaping into the dark space of an indeterminate future is always preferable to remaining buried in the graves dug by injustice, and, indeed, may be obligatory. But, if this is construed as a moral preference/obligation, then it is difficult to see how pragmatists can recognize its force. If moral imperatives are viewed in complete isolation from the possible weight of social, political, economic and cultural circumstances, pragmatists will be strongly inclined to argue that since they have no naked power, they carry insufficient authority to sanction insurrection when so viewed. For, as Edmund Burke remarked in a pragmatist moment:

Circumstances give in reality to every political principle its distinguishing color, and discriminating effect. [They] are what render every civil and political scheme beneficial or noxious . . .

Moreover, if isolated circumstantial considerations are factored in, then instrumental reasoning, or some proxy, needs to be applied, otherwise their role will be arbitrary. Medina does not claim to have solved this dilemma, but he has done pragmatists an enormous service by (1) clearly showing that it is a problem, (2) finding useful ways to talk about its implications, and (3) drawing attention to the work of others who are also addressing it.

Medina’s article is embedded in a trio of chapters that add flesh and color to some of the bones of his main arguments regarding both epistemic injustice and insurrection. Colin Koopman (Chapter 10) is concerned that by prioritizing Dewey’s political philosophy, pragmatists have generally deprived themselves of resources for motivating contestation even when unjust conditions clearly require it. He suggests that such resources constitute something of a half-way house from which it may be easier to reach those required for pragmatically incentivizing insurrection. At the same time, he contends that locating the motivation for contestation is a valuable endeavor in its own right. To facilitate this, he recommends a pragmatist turn away from Dewey’s “sunny-side Hegelianism” towards James’ “capricious pragmatism” while also embracing the “central theme of Du Bois”, namely “his emphasis on and paradigmatic practice of contestation” (182-3).

In Chapter 9, V. Denise James contends that while “the seeds of a conception of a radical pragmatist justice are present in Dewey, they require a black radical corrective” (168). For this, she says we can again call on the work of Du Bois, to which Angela Davis provides an invaluable supplement of historical consciousness. In Chapter 12, Paul C. Taylor enhances Medina’s approach to epistemic justice by amplifying some of his suggestive remarks about the transgressive potential of art. By drawing on Dewey’s phenomenological conception of aesthetics which “pushes [it] beyond the philosophy of art into the neighborhood of a broader practice of critical inquiry”, Taylor shows how Medina:

can build on his determination to move beyond narrow conceptions of the epistemic domain . . . and highlight domains of practice — expressive and aesthetic practice — that are bound up with the mechanisms of habituation and counterhabituation that are so central to his project. (223)

Earlier, in Chapter 2, Nancy Fraser outlines strategies for theorizing about justice in the present era when normal conceptions of it have broken down or become dysfunctional, and “familiar theories of justice offer little guidance” (40). In trying to create ways of properly responding to the ensuing situation of abnormal justice, she doesn’t so much anticipate Medina’s dilemma as put a different spin on it. Insurrection undermines what is generally accepted and hence workable. This puts a pragmatist who wants to find an inducement for taking that route to tackle injustice in a tricky position. For, as Fraser reminds us, if normal conventions and practices of justice are rendered unworkable, then “in the absence of a relatively stable framework for vetting and redressing claims”, it is impossible to follow through on “emancipatory change” (59). However, on her account, instability is already rife in the present global situation, which means pragmatists are not just in the awkward position of needing to conjure up plausible motivation for radically challenging conventional justice, but also now need to find ways of dealing with the actual results of such challenges. This is a dilemma for everyone, not just pragmatists.

Fraser’s article, clearly the precipitate of an innovative body of work, is the most ambitious and theoretically complex in the collection and deserves more attention than there is space for here. Christopher Voparil also makes the latter point in Chapter 3, which serves as an astute pragmatist commentary on Fraser’s sophisticated and ingenious attempt to “fashion a new genre of theorizing for abnormal times” which she calls “reflexive justice” (61). She intends this genre to embody the best of both abnormal and normal justice by remaining open to “novel claims”, yet with enough “closure” to get things done (59-60). Voparil homes in on places where he fears Fraser’s approach seems close to straying from a “pragmatist working program of ameliorating injustice” (66). To help prevent this he suggests enlisting the aid of Jane Addams and Rorty, both of whom identify socio-experiential elements required to keep theoretical manoeuvres sensitive to “pressing current injustices” (66).

Pragmatism and Justice is able to encompass such a wide range of issues, many of which I have been unable to mention, because the various authors show how these can be tackled in ways which dissolve or transpose conventional demarcation lines between practical and methodological and/or theoretical inquiry. The result is an engagingly rich re-conception of how justice is best approached. It is one within which justice can be discussed in terms that have theoretical interest as well as practical force, but do not encourage inquirers to tidy everything up by finessing an overarching theory of its conceptual role and content within the confines of, say, a grand Rawlsian-style project.

The volume makes a welcome contribution to the literature on political philosophy, providing excellent course and research material. Pragmatists should discover much that is heartening. They will encounter refreshing new takes on a myriad of pragmatist thinkers, some famous, others less familiar. And many will no doubt appreciate how the contributors have enhanced, retrieved, and brought to life the radical thrust of pragmatist thought.

Those who believe, as this reviewer does, that pragmatists have tended to spend too much time setting out their stall and defending its wares against stale philosophical objections dating back to Moore and Russell, when they could have been showing what can be achieved by putting pragmatist ideas into practice, will find this volume something of a landmark breakthrough. It is one that Oxford University Press should be encouraged to build on by publishing other collections on subjects where pragmatism has been making similar headway.