Pragmatism and Objectivity: Essays Sparked by the Work of Nicholas Rescher

Placeholder book cover

Sami Pihlström (ed.), Pragmatism and Objectivity: Essays Sparked by the Work of Nicholas Rescher, Routledge, 2017, ix+282 pp., $ 140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138655232.


Reviewed by Michele Marsonet, University of Genoa


In this collection of 14 essays many aspects of classical and contemporary pragmatism are examined with reference, at least in most cases, to the work of Nicholas Rescher. Usually, those who are interested in pragmatism from an historical point of view tend to forget that, from the beginning, a substantial polarity is present in this tradition of thought. It is a dichotomy between what Rescher calls "pragmatism of the left", i.e. a flexible type of pragmatism which endorses a greatly enhanced cognitive relativism, and a "pragmatism of the right", a different position that sees the pragmatist stance as a source of cognitive security. Both positions are eager to assure pluralism in the cognitive enterprise and in the concrete conduct of human affairs, but the meaning they attribute to the term "pluralism" is not the same.


Sami Pihlström's essay deals at length with the dichotomy between realism and idealism in Rescher's work, probably one of the most controversial issues in his philosophical system. Pihlström takes into account the Rescherian strategies to overcome the potential conflicts between realism, idealism and pluralism, stressing that his pragmatism offers solutions which, however, are not totally satisfactory. Rescher endorses a sort of metaphysical realism, meaning that there is a real world which is mind-independent. At the same time, his realism is a human commitment that is presupposed for carrying on our inquiries. Pihlström notes that "Rescher's argument for the reality of things in themselves is the same as his argument for realism: these postulations are needed for us to be able to make sense of our experience. This is at the same time a pragmatic and a transcendental argument" (p. 17). Realism is, in sum, justified on a fundamentally idealistic basis, but Rescher insists that we know the world in human terms without conceding that this commits us to any sort of idealism. According to Pihlström, Rescher's conceptual idealism has several traits in common with Hilary Putnam's internal realism. He concludes that Rescher, "while developing a valuable version of pragmatic idealism-cum-realism, entirely lacks the meta-level worry regarding the coherence or meaningfulness of the realism debate" (p. 25).


Scott Aikin and Robert Talisse compare Rescher's brand of pragmatism with William James' pragmatist metaphilosophy, with special reference to James' famous work Pragmatism. They deem Rescher's position philosophically better than James', which is in their opinion characterized by "self-sealing and triumphalist tendencies" (p. 39), adding that, despite what Rescher claims, the outcome of his metaphilosophy is skeptical. We should not worry about this, however, since the reality of the situation of the finite knowers which human beings are is precisely that our knowledge has limits. The two authors think that pragmatists wrongly resist the skeptical tradition, holding that it leads to complete impracticability. Their view, instead, is that "given the problems, the breadth of disagreement, and the interminability of the debates, philosophical solutions are indexes -- to particular orientations, under specific dialectical circumstances, in light of scientific and historical developments at the time" (p. 42). So we may find solutions, realizing at the same time that they are never final. All this, of course, sounds very Rescherian. It would seem to follow that pragmatism is methodologically consistent with a form of mild skepticism, in which we do not really know in philosophy but, still, can reasonably hold views supported by arguments.


Griffin Klemick deals with one of the favorite figures of the so-called objective pragmatists, Frank Ramsey. Klemick thinks that Ramsey belongs to what Rescher calls "pragmatism of the right," i.e. an objective pragmatism in which truth, meaning and justification are by no means conceived of in a relativistic fashion. Rescher has worked extensively on Ramsey, acquiring and administering the Ramsey collection at the University of Pittsburgh. He also edited, along with Ulrich Majer, Ramsey's unfinished manuscript On Truth. Rescher deems Ramsey's views congenial because they manifest the deep normative concerns and realist sympathies of objective pragmatism. Deflationism about truth leads Ramsey to look for a pragmatist theory of meaning. Klemick observes, furthermore, that "Ramsey's endorsement of metaphysical realism leads him to bifurcate his theory of meaning, restricting his pragmatist account to apply only to statements in the non-representational secondary system . . . indeed, it lands him in skepticism and psychologism" (p. 48).


Robert Almeder deals with pragmatist philosophy of science, focusing on such fundamental issues as scientific inference (in particular induction), scientific explanation and scientific realism. Almeder notes -- as many others did before -- that Peirce is the pioneer to whom Rescher's objective pragmatism is greatly indebted. He shares the widespread opinion that pragmatism often (in my opinion "always") means different things to different people. And especially because:


depending on what one thinks pragmatism is, or should be, one might end up refusing to accept, for example, that Charles Peirce was a pragmatist, or even that William James was a pragmatist, when in fact they were both pragmatists, although . . . one had a more liberal concept of evidence than the other even when they both arguably advanced an epistemic concept of truth in terms of warranted assertibility (p. 72).


Almeder's own definition of pragmatism is the following:


pragmatists believe that the rational acceptability of a belief, either as an item of knowledge or as an item of justified belief, is ultimately a function of whether the belief in question is likely to be the best available instrument for our successfully adapting to the world in some fundamental and enduring way under the principle of homeostasis (ibid.).


Almeder rightly adds that, according to this definition, natural scientists can be, and have been, pragmatists. The conclusion is that there is no distinctive proposal about induction, scientific explanation and truth shared by all pragmatists, since this trend of thought really is a collection of positions that, more often than not, have very little in common.


Tom Rockmore recalls that, according to Peirce, Kant was a somewhat confused pragmatist. Rockmore deems this statement to be a contribution to a better understanding of the pragmatist tradition, particularly with regard to the issue of realism vs. idealism. He thinks that Peirce, while criticizing Kant, tried at the same time to build on his insights. Rockmore argues that:


Modern natural science necessarily assumes a mind-independent world as its cognitive object. Kant and Peirce propose very different accounts of what this means. The former concentrates on the theory of the natural sciences, which he mainly understands as physics. The latter is centrally concerned with the practice of natural science . . . Though Kant was a Newtonian, he objects to Newton's anti-metaphysical view of natural science, for which he substitutes a metaphysical view. Peirce defends a form of the modern view of natural science as self-contained and, hence, independent of philosophy (p. 101).


His conclusion is that Kant's confusion is due to his rejection of the experimental character of scientific knowledge.


Vincent Colapietro notes that:


The resurgence of pragmatism has taken various forms, from neo to paleo, from a development within analytic philosophy to a broadside against the dominant tradition in Anglophone philosophy. Today, we are still disposed to debate the extent to which contemporary pragmatism is a prolongation of, rather than a rupture with, the classical phase of this philosophical movement (p. 113).


He underlines the great difference which is easily trackable in the works of, for example, Rescher and Richard Rorty. The latter is the main representative of all those thinking that "pragmatism would have been much better off had Peirce not existed" (ibid.). Rescher, on the contrary, has drawn especially on Peirce, trying to fashion an essentially classic pragmatist approach to epistemological, metaphysical and ethical questions. He defends a hybrid kind of realism and objectivity, endorsing at the same time several idealistic tenets. Colapietro then deals with Rescher's pragmatic approach to categoreal schemes, underlining its efficacy and writing that "we can question the formulation or intelligibility of our questions, just as we can criticize the forms and efficacy of our modes of criticism. For most practical purposes, however, what Rescher calls our proto-categories define the highest limit of generality our concepts can reach" (p. 120). Colapietro also thinks that Rescher sometimes gets dangerously close to identifying being or reality with actuality, which means that he comes dangerously close to advocating the nominalism against which his master, Peirce, fought.


Jessica Wright analyzes Ramsey's behavior-based account of belief, arguing that it can deal with various cases of attitude divergence. She mainly draws from Ramsey's On Truth, concluding that "to attribute belief on the basis of a causal process or a suspiciously detectable 'structure' (or lack thereof) is to define belief too narrowly. It is too narrow because it leaves out attitudes that we regularly manifest but that are not asserted or assertable" (p. 147).


Rosa Mayorga analyzes Peirce's and Rescher's positions on normative theory, stressing the importance of pragmatism in this field. According to Rayorga, Rescher's pragmatism is indeed a continuation of Peirce's, but she argues that the first cannot be deemed to be a scholastic realist, because the two philosophers diverge on the question of the reality of ideals. Noting that, surprisingly, Rescher makes no reference to Peirce's normative theory in his writings, Rayorga goes on to explain that while for Peirce reasonableness is the highest ideal and permeates the world, for Rescher ideals are instead irrealities and cannot be found in the physical world. It follows that, in the field of normative theory, the two thinkers show significant dissimilarities.


Joseph Margolis returns us to the issue of realism. He clarifies his own kind of pragmatic naturalism, taking issue with some contemporary philosophers, and with John McDowell in particular. His opinion is that any form of Kantian a priori must be rejected without giving up the empirical realism which is so important for pragmatic naturalism. According to Margolis:


it's a mistake to think that realism is, finally, a specifically epistemological question. Once we turn from Kant to Darwin, it becomes clear that the general posit of realism is more a matter of spontaneous existential energy and expression than of confirmable belief: it's the expression of animal vitality itself, conatus, tacitly unquestioned but neither affirmed nor confirmed (p. 182).


Besides McDowell, Wittgenstein, Quine, Sellars and other contemporary thinkers -- but not Rescher, at least specifically -- are taken into account.


Joseph Pitt also shows that Rescher's work is indeed close to Peirce's, with particular reference to cognitive values. Pitt's main aim is to examine critically (yet sympathetically) the position of Rescher's objective pragmatism in contemporary debates on the notion of value and his justification of cognitive values. Pitt claims, and this is significant in my view, that "Rescher stands out in the terrain of twentieth-century philosophy dominated in North America by the analytic tradition as one who deeply adheres to the importance of language in the generation of knowledge, but not one who subverts all of human experience to the linguistic domain". Pitt also poses a fundamental question, "what makes someone a pragmatist?", and correctly answers that the essentials of pragmatism are difficult to pin down, just like the essentials of any other "ism" (p. 197). His opinion is that Rescher attacks the practical/theoretical distinction just:


to put the human being back in the world. There are two concerns at play here -- one has to do with a negative consequence of the way the Western philosophical enterprise has developed since René Descartes. The second has to do with devising a solution to that problem that does not devolve into the extreme relativism of a Richard Rorty (p. 199).


Pitt concludes that pragmatism, in Peirce and Rescher's meaning of the word, is useful because "it offers a way out of the solipsism/relativism dichotomy" (p. 204). He worries, however, about the fact that Rescher very rarely mentions community, and this may ultimately leave him in the solipsist camp.


Helmut Pape thinks that Peirce is the founder of the tradition of objective pragmatism, which has been subsequently developed by Rescher. He argues, against Rorty, that there is no dichotomy between objectivity and solidarity, thus detaching himself from popular versions of contemporary neo-pragmatism, and claims that Rescher's views on rationality and cooperation are based on a Peircean account of assertion and communication. Pape starts by noting that:


Leftist pragmatism received its skeptical, anti-philosophical thrust only recently in Rorty's version of pragmatism. Rescher forcefully rejects Rorty's thesis that, in place of truth and objectivity, philosophy should rather care about conversational constraints, feelings and solidarity. Rescher's pragmatism of the right, by invoking successful implementation and application in terms of method, stresses the link to external reality involved in practice (p. 205).


Among Rescher's books, Pape takes especially into account Realistic Pragmatism (2000), in which pragmatism is understood as a uniquely methodologically oriented kind of philosophy.


Timo Airaksinen analyzes pragmatist views on desire and on betterment, dealing with anxiety, happiness and gratification. Airaksinen notes that the method of betterment needs a dialectical rule of adjustment, and quotes Rescher as saying that, from a pragmatist viewpoint, human beings should aim at satisfying life in terms of personal happiness. Rescher also wants to conflate needs and desires because they are both observable facts. Airaksinen doesn't agree because he does not see how desires can be observable facts in the same sense as needs are (p. 232). His pragmatist conclusion is that "we first need to know what we want and then decide to what degree we reached the goal. The fact that we cannot get it all does not mean that we got nothing" (p. 236).


Diana Heney deals with pragmatist bioethics, commenting on Rescher's pioneering contributions to this field. She argues that Rescher's pragmatic method is useful in general methodological issues, in the philosophy of value and in the concrete problems of medical ethics. Heney poses a basic question, "must we accept that pragmatism's emphasis on agents as situated, and on the real features of our shared lives, rules out maintaining any meaningful conception of objectivity?", and shares Rescher's conviction that without a philosophically defensible conception of objectivity, the whole enterprise becomes relativized to the situations of various individuals. She also thinks that Rescher's pragmatist methodology is adaptable to the needs of contemporary bioethics, concluding that "a turn to Rescherian pragmatism -- which we might as well now recognize as a return to the insights of classical pragmatism -- should be regarded as promising for contemporary bioethics because it calls us to consider the lived problems of a shared moral life" (p. 251).


John Shook is interested in idealism in the context of ethics, and deems Rescher's Ethical Idealism the finest work on ethics produced by the pragmatist movement. Ethical ideals are necessary for a proper functioning of morality and, he adds, ideals in general are indispensable for any kind of intelligent practice. As Shook notes:


Rescher speaks of the 'limits of the possible' -- this is by no means a gesture towards the imagination's overreach where pure fancy lies. In the realm of human action, it is really possible to go beyond the limits of what ideally seems possible . . . Ideals are a tool for intelligent planning of the conduct of life (p. 254).


But since we need ideals for guiding rational action, they have both a cognitive and an emotive role in human conduct in general. Ethical ideals can be prescriptive, conclusive, and projective, and Shook concludes that Rescher's "view of the cognitive role of ethical ideals… is evidently in good company with his fellow pragmatists" (p. 273).


Given the title of the book, one might expect to read a collection of articles entirely dedicated to Rescher's thought. But in many essays his name is mentioned just a few times and in a couple of cases, is not mentioned at all. Also, there is no clear definition of what pragmatism is, except for the Rescherian one. This is surprising given that today so many authors define themselves as pragmatists, and that it is difficult to find a clear border line between pragmatism and analytic philosophy.