Pragmatism and the European Traditions: Encounters with Analytic Philosophy and Phenomenology Before the Great Divide

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Maria Baghramian and Sarin Marchetti (eds.), Pragmatism and the European Traditions: Encounters with Analytic Philosophy and Phenomenology Before the Great Divide, Routledge, 294pp, $140.00, ISBN 9781138094109.

Reviewed by John J. Stuhr, Emory University


This volume contains twelve essays by European and North American scholars. Following a brief introduction, the essays appear in roughly chronological order. The first section, "Early Encounters," focuses on the pragmatism of William James (with briefer discussions of C. S. Peirce and F.C.S. Schiller), the phenomenology of Husserl and Scheler, and the analytic philosophy of Wittgenstein, Russell, and Ramsey. The slightly shorter second section, "Later Encounters" includes essays that deal with pragmatists: James (again, or still), John Dewey, and C. I. Lewis; phenomenologists: Husserl (again with James) and Heidegger; and analytic thinkers: Carnap, Stevenson, Wilfrid Sellars, Quine, Putnam, Brandom, and the Finnish thinker Eino Kaila.

In "Philosophy in the Twentieth Century: The Mingled Story of Three Revolutions," co-editors Baghramian and Marchetti introduce what appear to be three central theses that are intended both to illuminate, and to be supported by, the following individual essays. The first thesis is that "the turn of the twentieth century witnessed the birth of three path-breaking philosophical schools: Analytic Philosophy, Phenomenology, and Pragmatism" (1). As a historical claim, this is not very accurate. The editors state that their book begins with a focus on exchanges "between Pragmatism and the two European traditions in early twentieth century, marked by such seminal writings as Peirce's "The Fixation of Belief" and James's Pragmatism, Frege's "Sense and Reference" and Moore's "The Nature of Judgment," or Brentano's Psychology from an Empirical Point of View and Husserl's Logical Investigations" (6). However, Peirce's "Fixation of Belief" was published in 1877, nearly a quarter-century earlier. Brentano's volume was published in 1874, even earlier. Frege's "Sense and Reference" appeared in 1892, two years after James's landmark Principles of Psychology.

Analytic philosophy, phenomenology, and pragmatism may have flourished in the twentieth century, but they all have nineteenth century dates of birth. This matters because it means that all three traditions have not simply intellectual origins in early twentieth century anti-idealism and anti-psychologism, but larger cultural origins in nineteenth century movements and developments -- from romanticism and Darwinism to industrialization and imperialism. At least from a pragmatic perspective, the origin of any theory is not wholly or merely theoretical. Some attention to the larger, practical cultural contexts of the births of analytical philosophy, phenomenology, and pragmatism would have been valuable here.

This issue aside, how do the co-editors understand analytic philosophy, phenomenology, and pragmatism? In two ways: by proper names and by philosophical commitments. The first way is more successful if less dramatic. On this view, analytic philosophy is the philosophy of Frege, Russell, Moore, Wittgenstein, and their followers. Phenomenology is the philosophy of Brentano, Husserl, Scheler, Heidegger, and their followers. Pragmatism is the thought of Peirce, James, Dewey, and their followers. As the editors acknowledge, lineages can become blurry -- e.g., are Rorty, Putnam, and Brandom more analytic or pragmatic? – but, on the whole, this is an uncontroversial way of grouping these thinkers. The second way, potentially philosophically more important, is modestly successful here. For example, the editors characterize analytic philosophy as an anti-idealistic conceptual analysis engaged with the natural sciences, and understand phenomenology as anti-idealistic description of the life world (1). However, to the extent that the life-world includes science (as distinct from scientism), this distinction begins to break down; similarly, to the extent that science takes up human experience as undergone, this same distinction breaks down from the other side. These breakdowns constitute the "mingling" of the concerns of these different philosophical schools. This is different from a mingling of approaches to these concerns. But anyone who thinks that phenomenologists do not analyze concepts or that analytical philosophers do not describe life is caught up in a fiction.

Here is the second main thesis: Every "isolationist account" of the origins and rises of analytic philosophy, phenomenology, and pragmatism is mistaken; instead of this "standard view" (5), these three philosophical traditions are co-mingled, "interwoven chronicles of connections," "multivoiced conversations," and the ongoing development of "affinities and alliances that are frequently ignored at the expense of an emphasis on differences" (3). Across these three schools of thought, the co-editors contend, we find "respective intellectual influences as well as a convergence in their philosophical agendas" (5). Something like this view surely is correct. As such, it is an important corrective to any view of these three (or any other) philosophical schools as wholly self-contained and independent of intellectual contact with all other thought, both contemporaneous and historical. Intellectual influences are many and messy -- and mainly unconscious even to persons striving to lead self-examined lives.

Accepting this point, I confess I do not know any philosopher or historian who holds what the co-editors call the "standard" or "isolationist" view. It seems something of a proverbial straw man; they do not attribute this view to anyone or cite any specific source for it. All this makes this second thesis seem less striking (though not less correct) because it appears wholly or largely uncontested. Moreover, as the editors acknowledge, their second thesis has been advanced with great care and in great detail by other scholars (including some of the authors of essays in this volume). This too makes the second thesis seem less striking (again though not less correct) because it appears less to "fill a gap" (3) and more to contribute to an already underway recognition of the inadequacy of providing an account of an intellectual tradition solely in the terms of that tradition itself.

The volume's most striking contribution to this project is signaled by the third thesis. This thesis has two parts. The first part is implicit in the earlier two theses: The history of philosophy in the twentieth century is not a history of two path-breaking philosophical traditions -- analytic philosophy and continental philosophy -- but, instead, a history of three such traditions -- analytical, continental, and pragmatic philosophy. The volume thus re-describes analytical and continental philosophy. No longer simply the two alternative, opposed, different philosophical traditions of the twentieth century, they now are understood as two traditions of European thought that share intellectual center stage with the pragmatic tradition of USAmerican thought.

This addition of pragmatism is not simply a quantitative matter -- a move from two to three intellectual traditions in the narrative of twentieth century philosophy. It is a qualitative matter: it assigns to pragmatism central significance in the philosophical revolutions of the twentieth century. This is the second part of the volume's third thesis. Claiming that pragmatism "lies equidistant between the analytic demand for clarity, rigor, and respect for the natural sciences and the Phenomenological emphasis on lived experience and its subjective manifestations," the editors claim this volume attempts "to show the various ways in which Pragmatism can helpfully be positioned as a mediator and reconciler between Analytic Philosophy and Phenomenology, and become a medium for a productive dialogue between them." They continue:

This rarely appreciated and often overlooked role played by Pragmatism may then contribute to the rewriting of the history of twentieth-century philosophy as a multivoiced conversation between competing yet kindred traditions rather than as a stark opposition between irreconcilable poles. (2)

This passage contains three different claims. In order to assess the success of the volume on its own terms, it is important to distinguish them. The three claims are: (a) Pragmatism can be positioned as a mediator and reconciler between analytic and phenomenological philosophies; (b) Pragmatism is a medium for a productive dialogue between analytical and phenomenological philosophers; and, (c) this may allow us to view the history of twentieth-century philosophy as a multivocal affair between competing yet kindred traditions rather than opposition between two irreconcilable camps.

In the first place, then, is pragmatism a medium for dialogue between analytical and phenomenological philosophers? Here one might wonder why there is a general need for a third-party medium. Can Wittgenstein and Merleau-Ponty, for example, talk to each other only through Dewey? In like fashion, one might wonder who gets to determine if a dialogue between analytical philosophers and phenomenologists via the medium of pragmatism is productive or not. If a pragmatist gets to decide, this seems to beg a lot of questions. This whole idea of pragmatism as concerned both with science and experience and, thus, as a medium or middle between analytical thinkers who love objectivity and science and phenomenological thinkers drawn to subjectivity and the everyday life-world brings to mind (for pragmatists at least) James's account of pragmatism as a middle-ground and best-of-both-worlds option between tender-minded theorists and tough-minded ones. In reality, however, pragmatism frequently encounters tender-minded thinkers who complain that it has made philosophy too tough-minded and also tough-minded thinkers who object that it makes philosophy too tender-minded. As a medium for the thoughts of others, pragmatism is not a reflection; it is a transformation.

In fact, several of the essays show that the problem is even more severe. In many cases, pragmatism does not produce a productive dialogue between analytical thinkers and phenomenologists; rather, it produces a not very productive exchange between itself and just one of the other two traditions. For example, Kevin Mulligan's clear account of Max Scheler's views of pragmatism in his "How to Marry Phenomenology and Pragmatism: Scheler's Proposal" makes evident that Scheler rejected pragmatic accounts of meaning, knowledge, and truth. As Mulligan puts it, early phenomenology was on speaking terms with pragmatism, but pragmatism's influence on Scheler principally was his rejection of pragmatism. Similarly, Tim Button's "Other Minds and God: Russell and Stout on James and Schiller" discusses an objection by analysts Russell and Stout against pragmatists James and Schiller that makes it evident that the former two simply could not understand how the views of the latter two avoided solipsism. This is a case of intellectual ships passing in the night rather than a narrative of productive exchange. As yet another example, James O'Shea's "The Analytic Pragmatist Conception of the A Priori: Lewis and Wilfrid Sellars" is a careful study of the notion of the pragmatic a priori in the work of C. I. Lewis and Wilfrid Sellars. It highlights the ways in which Sellars diagnosed problems and weaknesses in the account by Lewis. In this light, the work of Lewis might be viewed as productive for Sellars, but only in the sense of something to see through and move beyond. In his analysis of James and Quine on the role of emotions in belief, "In Defense of Wishful Thinking: James, Quine, Emotions, and the Web of Belief," Alexander Klein focuses on the real tension between these two thinkers and concludes that "proper pragmatists" (244) must side with James rather than Quine. So too in "Logical Empiricism Between Pragmatism and Neopragmatism," Sami Pihlström observes that a focus on philosophical anthropology marks a genuine difference between pragmatism and logical empiricism (263) -- a difference that is bound up with very different conceptions of science itself. Finally, in "Phenomenology and Pragmatism: Two Interactions. From Horizontal Intentionality to Practical Coping," Dermot Moran concludes that pragmatism's commitments to naturalism and the largely anti-naturalist, transcendental commitments of classical phenomenology constitute "one major point of divergence" (284) -- a point with immense social and political consequences that are not taken up in this volume (largely because pragmatism is here defined by epistemological, logical, and metaphysical commitments rather than pluralistic and democratic normative commitments.)

In these cases, pragmatism does not emerge as a productive medium for a three-part conversation. Instead, it appears to be one side of a variety of two-part conversations marked by misunderstanding, opposition, and no shared purpose. There are exceptions. James Levine's excellent "Russell, Pragmatism, and the Priority of Use Over Meaning," an account of Russell's "linguistic turn and pragmatism," makes a compelling case for ways in which, after the death of James, Russell's work in mathematical logic led to large common ground with pragmatism. Similarly, in "Peirce and Ramsey on Truth and Norms" Cheryl Misak shows the affinities between the views about truth and communities of belief of Peirce and Ramsey. Both Colin Koopman's essay, "Pragmatic and Analytic Evasions of Idealism: James and Wittgenstein on Conduct and Practice," and Anna Boncompagni's piece, "Wittgenstein and Pragmatism: A Neglected Remark in Manuscript 107 (1940)," illustrate pragmatic themes in the writings of later Wittgenstein, a view developed at length by Russell Goodman in his 2007 Wittgenstein and William James. (I note here that Koopman suggests that later James and that Dewey articulate or enable some form of idealism -- rather than the rejection of the idealism/realism dualism. My doubts here may be part of the pragmatic "interfamilial quarrels" to which Koopman refers.) Finally, John Capps's "The Pragmatic Origins of Ethical Expressivism: Stevenson, Dewey, and the International Encyclopedia of Unified Science," a thoughtful and nuanced discussion of pragmatism, emotivism, and expressivism -- the only essay focused on values -- explains persuasively the mutual and multi-level influence of C. L. Stevenson and John Dewey on ethical theory and the ethical import of science.

The second claim made by the co-editors about their aim for the volume is this: Pragmatism enables productive exchanges between analytical and phenomenological philosophers. Is this true? The volume provides too little evidence to answer this question. Only one essay in the volume puts pragmatism in sustained conversation with both analytical philosophy and phenomenology. Richard Cobb-Stevens's essay focused on James's Principles of Psychology, "Husserl and Wittgenstein: Two Very Different but Potentially Complementary Readings of William James," illuminates possibilities for simultaneous complementarity and difference. Given the volume's objectives, this lack of intellectual triangulation seems odd. Viewed as a matter of performance, it re-inscribes or reproduces the analytic/continental "great divide" that the volume seeks to overcome.

The third aim is for the volume to help us view the history of twentieth-century philosophy as a multivocal affair between competing yet kindred traditions rather than opposition between two irreconcilable camps. It seems to me that there is plenty of evidence to view twentieth-century philosophy as a site of kinship, contestation, and downright opposition. Which view is true? Pragmatism teaches us to replace that question with this one: For what purposes is it useful to view a century's philosophy as a group of competing but kindred traditions? For what purposes is it useful to view it as opposition between seemingly irreconcilable camps? Pragmatism teaches us to acknowledge our selective interests. This is one reason to bring pragmatism into conversation with other traditions.

Three small final points are in order. First, several of the essays take up the same texts, themes, and figures, but do not cross-reference or cite one another and seem more broadly unaware of each other. This is a missed opportunity. Second, there are a surprising number of typographical or proofreading errors in the volume; few change meaning or cause head scratching; a couple are humorous. Third, the book, now available only in hardback, has a list price of $140. That is likely to create a "great divide" between those who can access it and those who cannot. In the spirit of Peirce's dictum "Do not block the way of inquiry," Routledge should make this book available in paperback at a reasonable price. Its many insights deserve a broad audience capable of advancing its goals of constructive contestation and pluralistic cross-fertilization.