Pragmatism and the Philosophy of Religion

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Michael R. Slater, Pragmatism and the Philosophy of Religion, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 207pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107077270.

Reviewed by G. Scott Davis, University of Richmond


This book is refreshingly upfront in its goal of sketching "a contemporary pragmatist defense of the legitimacy of religious faith or, more specifically, of supernatural religious beliefs and practices." (6) This is coupled with the slightly different task of showing "how pragmatism can support robust, tolerant, and intellectually respectable forms of religious belief, ones which -- to paraphrase James -- neither begin nor end by turning supernatural religious commitments out of doors." (131) Taken together, Michael Slater's project turns on making credible the following claims:

1.     Some religious traditions depend, for their identity, on the truth of "supernatural" claims.

2.     Those traditions define themselves in terms of belief in those claims and in terms of practices based on the truth of those claims.

3.     Those beliefs, and at least some of the practices based on them, can be shown on pragmatic grounds to be intellectually respectable (whatever that turns out to mean).

4.     Commitment to those beliefs, and at least some of the practices based on them, can be defended on pragmatic grounds as legitimate in a contemporary pluralist intellectual and social world.

There's nothing mysterious about the motives for the project. Science popularizers such as Richard Dawkins have been joined by well-respected philosophers -- most notably Daniel Dennett -- in decrying supernatural beliefs as intellectually disreputable, probably dangerous, and certainly inappropriate to members of a modern and civilized polis. Illustrations, often drawn (for reasons I will not pursue) from Kansas, include the Westboro Baptist Church, Citizens for Objective Public Education, Sam Brownback, and the Kansas State Department of Education, which seems to attract creationists the way milkweed attracts monarch butterflies. Even less strident critics, perhaps willing to accept (3), are often inclined to follow Rawls in thinking it illegitimate to introduce those commitments into democratic political discourse. Thus if some philosophers are drawn to satisfying their "metaphysical needs" by embracing one of these religious traditions, and if it turns out "that pragmatism can be a valuable resource for defending traditional, realistic forms of religious faith," (171) then it's not surprising that such a philosopher would attempt to elaborate that defense.

The Tradition of Dewey

Slater's strategy is threefold, the least interesting strand of which comprises chapters four and five. Here he turns from James and Peirce to Dewey, and to Dewey's progeny, Philip Kitcher and Richard Rorty. "One of the distinctive features of Dewey's account of religion," writes Slater, "is its combination of naturalism, secularism, and accommodationism." (109) In A Common Faith, Dewey distinguishes "the supernatural" from "the religious," making it possible to distinguish "what is genuinely religious" from "beliefs, practices, and institutions" that have become inextricably entangled with the supernatural. (112-113) Supernaturalism obscures the real foundations of meaning and value in the goods of human interaction, and acknowledging this allows us to recognize that "goods actually experienced in the concrete relations of family, neighborhood, citizenship, pursuit of art and science, are what men actually depend upon for guidance and support." (115) The supernatural stage setting that has grown up to support these pursuits becomes destructive when outmoded dogma gets in the way of sustaining and enhancing "natural human values and relations." (123)

That Dewey persists in talking about "God as the object or focus of religious commitment," strikes Slater as "curious." (124) But rather than take the term to refer to some being, Dewey construes it, and analogous terms, as "symbols . . . representations of moral and other ideal values or ends, which do not necessarily entail any supernatural commitments." (125) Once he makes this move, then harmonizing the various historical religions is simply a matter of determining how each reflects "the unity of all ideal ends arousing us to desire and action." (127) Of course, as Slater makes clear, even the liberal democrat who shares Dewey's hope for social solidarity, will not, if she is a Christian, be inclined to adopt this revision, if only because she may well believe that what prospects we have for that solidarity are grounded in the sacrificial and redemptive love that the second person of the Trinity made accessible to sinful humanity. These beliefs, at least for a fair number of Christians, are not symbolic; they state the most important facts about human life and values. Dewey's hopes for humanity may be noble, but he has not demonstrated that his is the best explanation of the development of humanity. Consequently, "the traditional theist has very little reason to take Dewey's criticisms of her religious beliefs and practices seriously." (130)

Turning to the "neo-Deweyans," Slater treats first Richard Rorty and then, in much more detail, Philip Kitcher. This is, I think, a strategic mistake. Kitcher's "secularism," as Slater notes, "is more robustly and straightforwardly naturalistic than Rorty's." (139) Thus Kitcher stands closer to Dawkins and Dennett, and thus the more recent critique of religion. Kitcher, unlike Dewey, argues "against the rationality of religious of religious belief." (140) Like Hume, he bases his argument on the fact of religious diversity, and in doing so improves on Dewey, because

a number of distinguished contemporary Christian philosophers, including William Alston, Philip Quinn, and William Wainwright, have acknowledged that the fact of religious diversity is one of the most serious -- if not the most serious -- epistemological challenges to the rationality of religious commitment. (141)

Given this diversity, any particular commitment would seem to be arbitrary, thereby subverting its intellectual respectability. But of course, the same holds true for any comprehensive secularism as well. Though Kitcher seems to follow Dewey in accommodating religion as an orientation to the world and human values, thus distancing himself from "militant atheists such as Richard Dawkins and Daniel Dennett," (148) his claim that priority should be given to values that are not grounded in religious belief strongly suggests that "Kitcher is issuing terms of surrender to traditional religious believers." (149)

This is why I think Slater should have privileged Rorty over Kitcher. Given his anti-foundationalist and fallibilist approach to knowledge, Rorty is much less inclined to question the intellectual respectability of religious beliefs. In the last years of his life, Rorty focuses on religion as "conversation-stopping," (137) thus ill-suited for the democratic pursuit of the common good. In 2003, he narrows the scope of his criticism to "anti-clericalism." (137) While Slater is correct that the aspects of religion that Rorty is willing to endorse "happen to be ones that are less than compelling to traditional theists," (138) he is not issuing terms of surrender. Slater rightly notes that Rorty's position "reflects an epistemically humble version of atheism that is, if anything, even less hostile toward traditional religious belief and practice than Dewey's." (138) He is simply arguing that if and when a believer invokes clerical authority in justification for some act or policy that would otherwise be considered cruel or unjust, he has overstepped the bounds of democratic acceptability. This seems a more eirenic, if perhaps more philosophically indifferent stance than Kitcher's.

The Pragmatism of James and Peirce

A much stronger strategy for legitimating religious commitments is found in James and Peirce. Opening up chapter one, Slater writes that

James developed an empirical and inductive approach to religion which drew upon the methods of science and the best psychology of his day but which also eschewed any commitment to materialism, scientific positivism, or the assumption that the study of religion should be (or could be) value free. (8)

This is James the friend and follower of Peirce. Both were trained in the physical sciences. James had recently entered Harvard's Lawrence Science School when he first met Peirce, in 1861. He was in medical school when Peirce gave the Lowell Lectures that announced his assault on both the Cartesian and the "nominalist" approaches to knowledge, and they met more or less regularly during the 1870s, as Peirce developed the approach to inquiry that lies at the heart of pragmatism. For both, the reductive determinism that was beginning to hold sway in the natural sciences couldn't be maintained in the face of the diversity of the phenomena of experience. Doubt engages inquiry, which always begins in medias res, using the body of currently undoubted background belief to secure "our local aims in assertion, belief, and deliberation." (88, citing Cheryl Misak) While the goal of inquiry is truth, the hypotheses we produce are fallible and subject both to criticism and revision. The Cartesian quest for foundations is simply misguided and likely to retard genuine inquiry, as Sellars would put it, into how things in the broadest possible sense of the term hang together. This pragmatism, "has the additional virtue of cohering with what Sellars called the 'manifest' and 'scientific' images of the world or, more prosaically, what we might simply call 'common-sense' realist and scientific realist ways of thinking about the world." (170)

When James applies this to religion, it results in the "rejection of essentialist and sui generis conceptions of religion." (15) This is Slater at his best. He recognizes that Russell McCutcheon and others have simply misunderstood James in identifying him "with currently unfashionable theorists of religion such as Rudolph Otto and Mircea Eliade." (16) There are no non-arbitrary criteria for sorting one set of beliefs and practices into the "Religion" box and excluding another. Nor does religion, whatever we might decide that might mean, spring full-blown from the spirit. Slater rightly sees that "James nowhere defends the view that religion should be immunized from rational criticism or that it should not be studied as an academic subject using the tools of philosophy and the natural and social sciences." (18) As a pragmatist, it should come as no surprise that his approach "differs from most contemporary theorists of and approaches to religion in that it does not entail a reductionist explanation of religion in terms of underlying natural causes, whether of the biological or the social-historical variety (or some combination of the two)." (18)

Slater nicely disposes of the claim that James over-emphasizes the individual, while noting that some key thinkers, from Durkheim to Geertz, have worried that he neglects the "social nature of religion." (14, n. 16; 19-23) His approach to the study of religion is pluralist in method and open-minded in metaphysics. We might, for some purposes, use experimental and empirical methods to determine how things hang together for particular individuals in particular social contexts, though we are always going to carry the burden of making sense of what they say and what they do in ways that are, for the most part, non-pathological. James's critique of "medical materialism" stands as one of the finest pieces of pragmatist prose, brilliantly highlighting the way "that naturalistic theories of religion tend to assume from the outset -- and without sufficient empirical support -- that religion has purely natural causes." (27) As a matter of logic, the beliefs of some individual, shared with other members of his cohort, are either true or they are not. This is what we mean by "common-sense realism." But to insist "that methodological naturalism -- the view that only naturalistic explanations should be admitted for the purposes of doing scientific or scholarly inquiry -- should be a basic commitment in the academic study of religion" is to beg the question not just against the beliefs of a religious person, but against his rationality. (27) And this, for the pragmatist, is to block the road of inquiry.

The implications of pragmatism for thinking about religion come out nicely in Slater's discussion of Peirce's "Neglected Argument for the Reality of God." Slater notes up front that Peirce's discussion "is not (or, rather, does not purport to be) an argument for the existence of God in the standard sense." (82) In accord with Peirce's view of inquiry, it is a "product of 'musement,' by which Peirce means the activity of 'considering some wonder in one of the three Universes or some connection between the two of the three, with speculation concerning its cause." (83) Putting to one side any discussion of "Firstness,' "Secondness," and "Thirdness" -- Peirce's "universes of experience" -- the argument is surprisingly straightforward. Imagine I am on a train, watching the scenery go by, and begin to reflect on the ways in which human ingenuity meshes with the workings of nature to allow us to achieve our ends. I might then notice that, despite the unnatural cold, the days are lengthening, soon to bring the buds to the trees, the birds back to the yard, and the warm breezes of April. "What Peirce thinks," writes Slater, "is that when we reflect upon the causes of these features of reality in an attitude of musement, or pure intellectual play, our natural tendency will be to perceive a purpose behind them." (83) This is likely to bring the "muser" to conclude that something like the god (the kind, not the proper name "God") of traditional theism is the best available explanation, at which point, "under normal conditions she will be naturally inclined to believe in God and seek to adjust her conduct in the light of her belief." (84) This is neither the "argument from design" nor, once the muser concludes that such a god must be a necessary being, the "ratio Anselmi." It is, rather, an hypothesis based on experience and reflection, and subject to all the usual fallibilistic criticisms. Nonetheless, the believer, "can properly regard her belief in God as true," in the way that any inquirer must if she is going to pursue and develop the hypothesis into a more substantial account of reality. (86)

A Sweet Nostalgia for the Analytic Past

Slater might have stopped here, embracing the view that Nicholas Wolterstorff has promoted since the mid-1970s, and most thoroughly articulated (to my mind), in "Can Belief in God Be Rational If It Has No Foundations?" (Plantinga and Wolterstorff 1983, cited on 200). The answer is "sure," and Slater does cite Wolterstorff's later remark that, "faith is not the property of the intelligentsia; it inhabits all those to whom God is revealed in Christ. As such, it's OK as it is. It can use the ministrations of Christian theology. But it doesn't need to be rationally grounded to make it acceptable." (77) Wolterstorff has gone on to defuse the critics of belief, as in his "An Engagement with Rorty," (138) and more recently to argue the centrality of Christian agape in the pursuit of human rights and social justice; but this is not part of Slater's program.

Instead, as in his chapters on James and Peirce, as well as chapters six and seven, Slater attempts to engineer the convergence of a pragmatism open to the musings of the believer with natural theology as practiced in the analytic style by Plantinga, Swinburne, and others. But the pragmatist, believer or non-believer, will be inclined to wonder why we should bother. Slater's "pragmatic case for weak metaphysical realism," (158ff) doesn't achieve much of anything beyond translating the "common-sense realism" of Peirce into the vocabulary of Putnam and others. Slater's critique of the "anti-realism" of Tillich and Gordon Kaufman (164-168) is very well done, but beyond that (non-negligible) achievement, the urge to link pragmatism to analytic apologetics seems little more than a nostalgia for the heady graduate days of possible worlds, counterfactuals, and transworld depravity. Philosophers who are still drawn to that paradigm are likely to find many interesting connections in the parts of Slater's book I've chosen not to discuss. But for many, particularly those interested in anthropology, the cognitive study of religion, and the social sciences, it's not clear what those apologetics provide. Honest to goodness "irrationality" turns out to be hard to come by outside of locked wards and the books of Oliver Sacks. The "rational foundations" sought by Slater, as Wolterstorff might say, don't have any work to do. The pragmatism of Peirce and James (at least when the latter manages to avoid talking about truth) was designed to expose the dogmatism of 19th century positivist science and its philosophical epigones. The "reformed epistemology" of Plantinga and Wolterstorff was designed to expose the dogmatism of anti-religious logical positivism in the style of Ayer, Mackie, and others. (177ff) The various pragmatists whom Slater doesn't discuss -- Cornel West, Jeffrey Stout, and others (4) -- are inclined to think that a therapeutic helping of pragmatism has cured them of any nostalgia for the combats of yore and freed them to move on.