Pragmatism as a Way of Life: The Lasting Legacy of William James and John Dewey

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Hilary Putnam and Ruth Anna Putnam, Pragmatism as a Way of Life: The Lasting Legacy of William James and John Dewey, David Macarthur (ed.), Belknap Press, 2017, 496 pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674967502.

Reviewed by David Boersema, Pacific University


When Hilary Putnam (HP) passed away in 2016, obituaries appeared in the New York Times and other venues. He was called a "giant of modern philosophy," and, indeed, among academic philosophers he was universally recognized as having been influential in a variety of areas, with a number of his articles anthologized in a wide range of publications. While known to some philosophers, HP's wife, Ruth Anna Putnam (RAP) has not received the level of recognition or accolade as HP. This current book is in part an attempt to address and respond to this discrepancy. The book contains a brief introduction by the editor, David Macarthur, followed by twenty-seven essays. Ten of the essays were authored by HP, fifteen by RAP, and two were co-authored. They are collected into three sections: (1) The Insights of Classical and Neo-Pragmatism (seven essays), (2) Key Topics in the Pragmatism of James and Dewey (thirteen essays), and (3) Pragmatist Conceptions of Moral Value and Democracy (seven essays). As Macarthur notes, this collection of essays constitutes most, but not all, of the writings on pragmatism by HP and RAP. An appendix provides bibliographic citations for those omitted essays.

There are several volumes that are intended as analyses and evaluations of HP's work. Two recent ones are Hilary Putnam: Pragmatism and Realism, edited by James Conant and Urszula M. Zeglen (Routledge, 2002) and The Philosophy of Hilary Putnam (a volume in the Library of Living Philosophers series), edited by Randall E. Auxier, Douglas R. Anderson, and Lewis Edwin Hahn (Open Court, 2015). Macarthur's volume, however, is not intended as a similar work; rather it is a compilation and presentation of HP and RAP vis-à-vis pragmatism. In the context of the essays, of course, both authors engage with other philosophers and address criticisms of their views, but this book as a whole is not meant to be yet another give-and-take with critics.

Macarthur enunciates nine reasons for collecting in a single volume many of the writings of HP and RAP on classical and neo-pragmatism. The first reason is that acknowledging "the provenance of Hilary Putnam's neo-pragmatism in the writings of Ruth Anna Putnam is an indispensible contribution to a proper appreciation of Hilary Putnam's mature philosophical outlook" (p. 2). The second reason is, given the vagueness of just what pragmatism is today, to help navigate through this quandary via HP's and RAP's sustained writings. Third, Macarthur hopes to provide clarity about James and Dewey via HP's and RAP's elucidation and application of their ideas. Fourth, via the Putnams, one can better appreciate a more enlightened understanding of the contemporary world and the value of "the social and experimental character of reason" (p. 4). A fifth reason for a volume that includes works of both authors is to articulate, better than via either author singly, their "pluralist democratic experimentalism" (p. 5). Sixth, the hope is to articulate the lessons of pragmatism, particularly commitments to fallibilism, pluralism, intersubjectivity, an agent's point of view, and a rejection of a fact/value dichotomy. Seventh, says Macarthur, their writings "radically reconceive" the role of the moral philosopher. An eighth reason is stylistic; HP's and RAP's writings can and do address philosophical issues via ordinary, jargon-free language, and, so, can be accessible to non-specialists. Finally, and relatedly, their pragmatist emphasis on experience is a "major advance over the traditional empiricist (but curiously non-empirical!) view of experience as 'private' sense data" (p. 8). How and whether these reasons are successfully met will be discussed below.

Numerous themes permeate the essays, covering a range of philosophical and metaphilosophical topics and issues. At the broadest level, both authors discuss what pragmatism is, or better, what a pragmatist perspective is. RAP especially emphasizes that pragmatism is less a systematic doctrine of beliefs and more an attitude or temperament toward addressing problems. Even more than HP, she stresses the notion of agency and that what matters is an "agent's point of view." We are agents in the world; we are not spectators, that is, disembodied minds or souls that are passive knowers of the world. In conjunction with this emphasis on agency is the view that epistemic and metaphysical idealism are mistaken. To be agents in the world presupposes that there is a world in which one acts and with which one engages. We are situated knowers and goal-directed doers, both of which deny the feasibility of idealism.

Issues dealing with epistemology and metaphysics abound, especially, as one might expect, in HP's essays. In particular, these are in the forefront of eight of HP's ten essays. Much of his concern here is twofold: (1) disarming the claims of critics of pragmatism -- and of James, specifically -- that pragmatism is anti-realist, and (2) offering his take on a better view regarding these topics. First, then, with respect to disarming critics, HP quotes (more than once) a portion of a letter that James wrote to a critic, Dickinson S. Miller, regarding his view. It is worth citing here in full:

Dear Miller,

I got your letter about "Pragmatism," etc. some time ago . . . I sent you a week ago a "Journal of Philosophy" with a word more about Truth in it, written at you mainly: But I hardly dare hope that I have cleared up my position. A letter from Strong, two days ago, written after receiving a proof of that paper, still thinks that I deny the existence of realities outside the thinker, and Perry . . . accused Pragmatism (although he doesn't name me) of ignoring or denying that the real objects play any part in deciding what ideas are true. I confess that such misunderstandings seem to me hardly credible . . .

Apparently it all comes from the word Pragmatism -- and a most unlucky word it may prove to have been. I am a natural realist. The world per se may be likened to a cast of beans on a table. By themselves they spell nothing. An onlooker may group them as he likes. He may simply count them all and map them. He may select groups and name them capriciously, or name them to suit certain extrinsic purposes of his. Whatever he does, so long as he takes account of them, his account is neither false nor irrelevant. If neither, why not call it true? It fits the beans-minus-him, and expresses the total facts of the beans-plus-him. Truth in this total sense is partially ambiguous, then. If he simply counts or maps, he obeys a subjective interest as much as if he traces figures. Let that stand for pure "intellectual" treatment of beans, while grouping them variously stands for non-intellectual interests. All that . . . I contend for is that there is no "truth" without some interest, and that non-intellectual interests play a part as well as the intellectual ones. Whereupon we are accused of denying the beans, or denying being in any way constrained by them! It's too silly! (p. 161)

The point, for HP, is that neither James, nor pragmatism generally speaking, is committed to anti-realism, if that means a rejection of a reality that is external to agents, or committed to truth as subjective or mere expediency (or "whatever works"). Rather, for HP (and James), truth is not a dyadic relation between facts and beliefs; instead it is a triadic relation, among facts, beliefs, and situated agents. He remarks repeatedly that what is at issue in the relation between thought and object is "ways something can be," but the ways something can be are not merely given and are always open for further interpretation. There is no single way that something is or can be, but there are ways that something cannot be. For HP, knowledge of facts presupposes knowledge of categorizations and values, but, conversely, knowledge of categorizations and values presuppose knowledge of facts. Truth is normative as well as descriptive. Simple correspondence between word and object (or sentence and states of affairs) provides no, or very little, explanatory force or value. The pragmatist in HP contends that, since inquiry is never disinterested, questions of what is the case, how we know it, and why we care, are intimately intertwined. The realist in HP contends that, however inquiry is to be addressed, there are objective and reasonable standards, independent of any agent's interests, but not independent of all interests. Expediency, both HP and James insist, is not a sufficient criterion for truth or a commitment to what is real. The beans are "out there," but what even counts as being a bean involves categorizations, and truths about beans are, in part, dependent upon those categorizations and (cognitive) interests. There is no view from nowhere, but there is something viewed! HP insists over and over that, while there might not be a single correct description of the world, there certainly are many incorrect descriptions. (How many stars are there in the Milky Way galaxy? There might not be a single correct answer to this question, but "Twelve" is definitely incorrect.)

Related to these topics are the notions of fallibilism and verification, both of which HP discusses in several essays, in which he underscores his view that a pragmatist perspective is anti-foundationalist and anti-essentialist. How truth is determined is, to borrow a term from Rawls, a matter of reflective equilibrium, not a matter of metaphysical essences or epistemological foundations. Active intervention by interested inquirers, intelligently directed experimentation and attempts to falsify hypotheses are fundamental to rational belief fixation and to establishing what we can claim as true.

Another major focus of many of the essays, including those by HP as well as RAP, is the relationship between facts and values and, in particular, the fact/value dichotomy. Both authors repeatedly enunciate their rejection of this dichotomy, while recognizing that, in specific contexts and for specific concerns, facts and values are appropriately distinguished. (The fact of abortion and the value of abortion are obviously distinct from each other.) Both authors argue that there is a symbiotic relationship between facts and values and between their relationships to knowledge and truth. Minimally, scientific knowledge presupposes epistemic values such as judgments of simplicity, coherence, quantifiability, what counts as evidence, etc. Likewise, values judgments are indeed judgments; they are valuings that presuppose criteria and standards of reasonableness. "Why is abortion acceptable?" Because it is a means to further the self-determination of the mother. "Why is abortion unacceptable?" Because it is the killing of an innocent life. In both cases, an appeal is made to criteria and standards external to a given agent. One can appropriately speak of moral facts and moral knowledge, but, again, these are not givens. For both authors, establishing them is a matter of engaging with an extra-subjective reality -- or better, extra-subjective realities -- but via categorizations and interested inquiry.

Where the essays by HP focus largely, but certainly not exclusively, on epistemological and metaphysical concerns, the essays by RAP focus largely, but not exclusively, on axiological concerns. As already noted, she speaks to the fact/value dichotomy. In addition, however, she addresses topics of religion, politics, and meliorism (i.e., a belief in progress and improvement). She explicates what she takes as the misunderstanding by critics of James' and Dewey's conceptions of religion and offers her corrective to those misunderstandings. The primary misunderstanding is that -- similar to misunderstandings about their views on truth -- neither claims that religion is a matter of subjective truth or expediency. First, religion should be understood not as theology, but as passional experience. It is not a (mere) matter of holding specific beliefs, but a matter of experiencing and engaging in the world. Experience and engagement, of course, involves beliefs, but the emphasis is on an agent's actions in the world and interpretation of the world. This is the core of James' famous claim of "the will to believe" and Dewey's claim of "being religious." The focus is not a matter of epistemology, but of agency. Also, for both, and for RAP, the criterion and standard of religious belief is meliorism; it is a matter of what is borne out in one's actions and experience, particularly in the sense of not just making sense of things, but of changing and improving things. True religious faith, says RAP on behalf of James and Dewey, is a playing out in the world of judgments about facts and values.

Similarly, this emphasis on doing, not just cognizing, is what RAP sees as central to a pragmatist (especially via the works of Dewey) political commitment to democracy. Democracy, says RAP, is an embodiment of pluralism, itself an attitude and commitment to intersubjective agency and social experimentation. It is a creative act that is neither a case of givens or of subjectivity. "Democracy" is, in a word, a verb, and this, for RAP, is the core of pragmatism as an attitude or sentiment. Democracy is moral judgments writ large. It is character at the collective level, much as religion is character at the individual level, though both are components of a spectrum between the personal and the social. Agents' actions are continuous and interconnected; none occur in a vacuum of either time or place. Democracy, then, says RAP, is not (merely) a form of government, but of agency. Like religion, true democracy -- again, understood as agency, not governmental structures -- is also a form of meliorism.

It was noted above that Macarthur offers various reasons to explain and justify this present volume. As noted, he cited nine specific reasons, most of which correspond to goals that are indeed achieved. One reason was to show RAP's influence on HP's mature work. Yes, this appears obvious, and HP explicitly says so on a number of occasions. Another reason is to help clarify the thought and work of James and Dewey via the writings of HP and RAP. Again, yes: the bulk of the essays are, in fact, attempts to do just that; to largely clarify their thoughts, but also to apply them in addressing a multitude of philosophical issues, such as truth, essentialism, moral reasoning, democracy, etc. Yet another reason, says Macarthur, is that HP's and RAP's writings are jargon-free and, so, can be accessible to non-specialists, and along the way help to clarify just what pragmatism is. Yes, this too is true, although most of the included essays contain discussions of some technical issues and dialogues with other professional philosophers, so that non-specialists would be dropped into contexts that would need fleshing out (e.g., their disputes with Rorty). As for clarifying what pragmatism is, yes, these essays do go a long way toward this goal, and it is useful to include work from both authors, since RAP deals more with axiological and value-centered issues, while HP engages more with metaphysical, epistemological, and meta-philosophical issues.

Macarthur also claims that including work from both authors, as opposed to merely either separately, helps to articulate pluralist democratic experimentalism. It is not obvious that this is so, or why one would need these two specific authors to do so. Why wouldn't a volume that included only the give-and-take between HP and Rorty help to accomplish this task? Of more concern, however, is Macarthur's reason that the writings of HP and RAP "radically reconceive" the role of the moral philosopher. Macarthur notes:

No more is the moral philosopher seen as an expert wielding abstract and universal moral principles and rules from some imagined position of authority. For the pragmatist writing about ethics does not presume to any special knowledge or insight or training. Our authors presume no authority and openly admit that they can do no better than accept that, despite having limited knowledge, fallible capacities, and disruptive human passions, it is still worth the effort to engage in philosophical criticism of what we should do in order to overcome the domination of the poor by the rich, or the weak by the strong, as well as countering our all-too-familiar tendencies to self-aggrandizement or complacent and consoling myths. (pp. 6-7)

I confess it is not clear to me who among modern moral philosophers is guilty of these charges or would argue that moral reasoning or moral action would come from some imagined position of authority by wielding abstract and universal moral principles and rules. In addition, how is pragmatism a radical reconceptualization of moral questions or problems? What, for example, would be a pragmatist solution to the question of abortion? What is a pragmatist defense of legalized abortion, or a pragmatist denial of legalized abortion? What makes such a defense or denial pragmatist, and how, in any significant way, would such a defense or denial be different than, and more enlightened than, a non-pragmatist one? In what ways is James or Dewey more helpful in addressing and resolving this issue than, say, Singer or Rawls or Beauvoir? For that matter, is there a single pragmatist approach to such an issue, or are there multiple pragmatist approaches, much less pragmatist solutions? So, while the Putnams certainly offer thoughtful and fruitful discourse to questions of morality and ethics, it is not obvious that this constitutes a radical reconceptualization.

Along these lines, there is also a concern of whether the essays here really "do" pragmatism or primarily talk about it. As RAP remarks:

Dewey wrote, in the introduction to Reconstruction in Philosophy, "Philosophy will recover itself when it ceases to deal with the problems of philosophers and addresses the problems of men," where, of course, he meant by "men" human beings. Taking pragmatism seriously means to me developing a philosophy that will enable us to deal more effectively with the great problems that confront humanity. (p. 14)

Do the essays in this volume deal with the problems of humans? Do they address the great problems that confront humanity? I have to say that in large part they do not. In large part they address problems of philosophers (e.g., verificationism, essentialism, metaphysical realism, etc.). These, of course, can be seen as problems of humans -- for example, how, if at all, one's identity is essentially a matter of gender or ethnicity or geo-political origin -- and these are problems of humans, not just of philosophers. But, then, what are problems of philosophers that are not, or could not translate into, being also problems of humans? While some of the essays, especially those of RAP, mention a variety of problems that do confront humanity (e.g., climate change, racism, human treatment of non-human animals, etc.), they do not focus on those issues. The sorts of problems that many people face in their daily lives at the collective level (such as climate change) or at the personal level (such as whether or not to confront an offensive neighbor, or the do's and don't's of good parenting) again are mentioned, but very briefly, and are certainly not the focus of these essays. Is this itself a problem? For the purposes of publishing a book, no. Providing these essays in a single volume in order to clarify the views of the authors, and to help elucidate how they are proponents of pragmatism, is a fine and legitimate task. What would also be a fine and legitimate task is to expressly address how, as proponents of pragmatism, they address those problems of humans that pragmatism says are the important problems. What the Putnams do is to claim that, via a pragmatist lens and attitude, those problems can be better approached and addressed, but at this point that is all that they do. What would be a wonderful next step is to show how racism or climate change or international hostilities or dealing with difficult neighbors can not only be addressed via a pragmatist lens and attitude, but how and why that lens and attitude will accomplish their ends better than some non-pragmatist lens or attitude. This, it seems -- and both HP and RAP would endorse this -- would truly be a pragmatist way of life.