Pragmatism as Post-Postmodernism: Lessons from John Dewey

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Larry A. Hickman, Pragmatism as Post-Postmodernism: Lessons from John Dewey, Fordham University Press, 2007, 284pp., $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823228423.

Reviewed by Dennis M. Senchuk, Indiana University


This book, a collection of essays, suggests that Dewey has anticipated solutions to some major problems that plague postmodernism -- a loosely confederated movement which the author characterizes (with help from other scholars) as a rejection of epistemological foundationalism, objectivity, and metaphysical realism, as an affirmation of self-reflexiveness and relativism, and as an attempt to have meaning without transcendent value and action without absolute truth. The essays range over po-mo views on global citizenship, Rorty's neo-pragmatism, divers conceptions of technology, environmental concerns, and some straightforwardly expository discussions of Dewey's philosophy. At book's end, Hickman concludes that Dewey's (and Peirce's) views on habit afford post-po-mo solutions to po-mo problems about objectivity and the interminability of "self-referentiality, redescription, and reinterpretation" (p. 254).

Early in the book, Hickman cites Lyotard's well-known remark that the demise of "the grand narrative" is characteristic of "the postmodern condition" (p. 17). This remark, so evocative of precipitous proclamations about the death of the novel, suggests several possible interpretations to Hickman. Insofar as the outmoded grandeur is taken to be that of metaphysical systems purporting to explain everything, Hickman contends that Dewey qualifies as a postmodern. But this seems a bit off. Recall O.W. Holmes' assessment of Dewey's Experience and Nature as "incredibly ill-written" but with an "[unequalled] feeling of intimacy with the inside of the cosmos … . So methought God would have spoken had He been inarticulate but keenly desirous to tell you how it was." (From Fisch, Classic American Philosophers, 2nd Ed., p. 8.) Hickman does allow that Dewey is not thoroughly antagonistic to "metaphysics generally", but it needs saying that Dewey's philosophy, even though rarely taking a metaphysical turn, does indeed convey a "grand narrative".

One mark of a certain philosophical greatness is that, given some basic understanding of a philosopher's outlook, that philosopher's position on a host of other topics can be surmised. Pending more qualifications than one might care to add, this is true of, e.g., Descartes and Hume among the Moderns. This is also, I dare say, more true of Dewey than of Peirce and James among the Pragmatists. It would be overly simplistic to attribute this philosophical predictability to some handful of first principles or axioms from which all else is derived. In Dewey's case, there are some basic tenets and themes that come into play and various habits of thought that lead him down relatively familiar paths, even in apparently unfamiliar territories.

Mindful of Dewey's core commitment to a theory of inquiry, Hickman devotes a full chapter to it, but his discussions do not quite capture the kernel of Dewey's view. In nuce, that theory depicts thinking as issuing forth from some sort of breakdown of habits, including beliefs and assorted other rules of conduct. Problematic situations are those in which old ways of thinking and acting are no longer efficacious. These situations give rise to an impulse to inquire, which may lead to new habits -- new ways of thinking, of believing, and, in some cases, of acting overtly. Thinking is, on Dewey's view, not so much a matter of using tools; it is rather, as his philosophical soul-mate G.H. Mead wittily observed, what happens when the damn tool breaks.

Hickman nicely describes how, on Dewey's view, "Science grows out of common sense as its tools of inquiry become more refined." But Hickman ties this back to Lyotard's dictum, by claiming that such science is no 'grand narrative': "It does not tell us how the world is in any final sense, and it is not the paradigm for all other forms of inquiry" (p. 213). Perhaps not, but Dewey's more general theory of inquiry is his paradigm for scientific and all other forms of thoughtful inquiry, however divergently refined, and that theory is a key component of a great tale about how, finally, the world of human experience could in principle lack finality.

Other keys to Dewey's philosophy are conspicuously absent from Hickman's retelling of it. Most notable, perhaps, are items variously associated with Dewey's theory of education. A rather large nutshell would be needed to contain the meat of these views, but it may be possible to convey some rough idea of tenets and principles especially pertinent to Hickman's enterprise. While Hickman notes that Dewey's chief educational aim is excellence, this is only worth noting if excellence is explicitly identified with a socially sustainable growth of experience. Hickman also attributes to Dewey the claim that freely developing human beings "are capable of generating the aims and methods by which further experience can grow in ordered richness" (p. 192). Capable perhaps, but altogether unlikely Dewey would insist, absent the funded wisdom of adults and the appropriate social and physical circumstances.

Dewey is not Rousseau, though the two do share a belief in the centrality of a theory of education to an overall philosophy. Indeed, Dewey went so far as to define philosophy as the "general theory of education" (MW 9.338)[1]. And insofar as accounts of desirable ontogenetic development may count as narratives of Everyman (or, better, Everyone), Dewey's writings on educational theory rank with Rousseau's Emile as a grand story. Dewey's Experience and Education (1938) affords a masterful plot outline for human development, a veritable philosophy for living. The central theme of the book is Dewey's own theory of experience. Experience, he writes, is an interplay of objective and internal conditions and so requires a proper fit between them. This is his principle of interaction. "[E]very experience enacted and undergone modifies the one who acts and undergoes, while this modification affects … the quality of subsequent experiences." This is his principle of the continuity of experience. (LW 13.18.) The latter principle is said to rest upon a biological construal of habit and, in concert with the former principle, suggests that experience lives on as much in one's social and physical environment as it does inside a person.

The truly excellent experiences are "educative," promoting the overall growth of experience; the bad ones are "miseducative", having the (habituating) "effect of arresting or distorting the growth of further experience" (LW 13.11). The quality of an experience is gauged both by its agreeableness or disagreeableness and by its (less obvious) influence on subsequent experience.

Hickman unaccountably attempts to explicate Dewey's views on habit in terms of Peirce's. This may be a case of trying to explain the translucent in terms of the opaque. Though I have no doubt that Peirce's hyper-extended notion of habit would repay philosophical efforts to mine it, Hickman's deployment could saddle Dewey with some views that are superficially if not deeply implausible. Peirce after all held that laws of nature are habits in progress, that the world is becoming ever more regular. He also believed, as Hickman himself notes, that Lamarck's views on habit are superior to Darwin's.

Hickman's strategy of explaining Dewey in terms of Peirce also draws attention away from one fundamental opposition between the two pragmatists, a contrast that is germane to Hickman's program. Peirce's pragmatic theory of truth conceives of the practical bearings of truth as no less than an end of inquiry. Fallible but self-corrective and communal scientific inquiry leads, as if by destiny, to a consensus of opinion. "The opinion which is fated to be ultimately agreed to by all who investigate, is what we mean by the truth …" (CP 5.407). This is one sort of answer to post-modernists who see what they take to be a self-evident relativism of inquiry to inquirers as fatal to scientific pretensions to objectivity. But Dewey's line of thinking takes another, different turn which we may chart by attending to his views on inquiry, habit, and experience. The apposite Deweyan lesson for post-modernists that Hickman doesn't draw is this: since inquiry leads to new habits, and they change the situation confronting and incorporating each of us and our social, cultural and physical environs, there is the distinct possibility -- if not inevitability -- of an ever-expanding world, of ever-changing worlds of experience. Contra Peirce, such an ever-changing world might not lend itself to any fated consensus of opinion as to what it really is. (For all that, of course, Peirce could still plausibly maintain his conception of truth and reckon, as he sometimes does, that truth might not be in the cards.)

Peirce and Dewey do share some commitment to the idea that scientific inquiry is correctable on the basis of its own evolving methods and tools of inquiry. Such corrigibility might well qualify as a pragmatic reconstruction of the notion of objectivity. However, it is notably ironic that insofar as Dewey's theory of inquiry has any real applicability, as a psychological theory, to the thought processes of the post-moderns, the theory would not predict that they would be inclined to embrace any reconstruction of objectivity. Far from seeing the lack of objectivity as a problem, post-moderns take the realization of its absence to be indicative of their own sophisticated understanding of inquiry. Its apparent lack does not impede their favored ways of thinking and believing, much less does it present an obstacle to their actions. As Peirce notes, there are several bad ways of thinking that serve to settle our beliefs. How, I wonder, would he have classified some settled post-modern dismissiveness that is content to accuse its critics of naïveté and of outmoded (read "modernist") ways of thinking?

Hickman applauds Rorty for his role in bringing classical pragmatism back into Anglo-American mainstream philosophy and thus clearing the way for philosophers to address real problems of real people. And Hickman says that the point of departure for his book is Rorty's remark that James and Dewey are "waiting at the end of the road" that post-modernists are now traveling (p. 13). But Hickman is critical of Rorty's "neo-pragmatism" and indicates a number of non-Rortyan ways in which Dewey's thinking advances beyond the post-moderns. Hickman questions whether Rorty's own thinking really advances beyond classical pragmatism, and he challenges Rorty's interpretation of Dewey as attempting to "rub out" distinctions between arts and sciences. He faults Rorty for the weak political recommendation that liberals should avoid "theoretical excesses" and should concentrate instead on being "imaginatively melioristic" private citizens (p. 57). Hickman sees that recommendation as inferior to Dewey's experimentally-oriented approach to social and political improvement.

Hickman also sees Rorty as echoing (and as attributing to Dewey) Habermas' notion that nothing "take[s] precedence over the result of agreement freely reached by members of a democratic community" (as quoted, p. 38). How is such a philosophy politically significant? According to Rorty, "it encourages people to have a self-image in which their real or imagined citizenship in a democratic republic is central … [it] clears philosophy out of the way in order to let the imagination play upon the possibilities of a utopian future" (as quoted, pp. 58-9). Why isn't this a Deweyan account?

Hickman is surely right to decry the lack of any Deweyan experimentalism in Rorty's approach, but there's more to the story than that. Dewey's social ideal of democracy is not so much a matter of a strictly egalitarian voting procedure as it is a social spirit and its correlative set of social arrangements within a community. "A democracy … is primarily a mode of associated living, of conjoint communicated experience" (MW 9.93). He wants a school classroom that reflects and engenders the democratic values and arrangements that he favors in the larger community to which the school belongs, but he does not want schoolchildren to vote on whether to have full-day recess and lunch.

Why should we favor democratic arrangements? Is it possible to break out of a circle that justifies them as the unforced consensus of people living under them? Here is Dewey's recipe for answering such questions:

In seeking [a measure for the worth of any given mode of social life], we have to avoid two extremes. We cannot set up, out of our heads, something we regard as an ideal society. We must base our conception upon societies which actually exist, in order to have any assurance that our ideal is a practicable one. But, as we have just seen, the ideal cannot simply repeat the traits which are actually found. The problem is to extract the desirable traits of forms of community life which actually exist, and employ them to criticize undesirable features and suggest improvement. (MW 9.88-89)

The contrast with Rorty's ungrounded utopian thinking approach is palpable. There is a kind of experimentalism about Dewey's approach, but, contrary to what Hickman seems to suggest, this experimentalism is not a matter of applying science's refined tools of inquiry. Social modifications may count as experiments, but it is their desirability that needs to be assessed.

Contra Rorty, Dewey does not view philosophy as an enabler of utopian fancy. Bearing in mind that Dewey once identified philosophy with the theory of education, we can discern in the following remarks (from Experience and Education ) a more situated but still theory-oriented view of philosophy than we find in Rorty: "All social movements involve conflicts which are reflected intellectually in controversies." Educational movements are no exception, and the conflicts and controversies involved in them "only set a problem" for theory. "It is the business of an intelligent theory of education to ascertain the causes for the conflicts that exist and then, instead of taking one side or the other, to indicate a plan of operations proceeding from a level deeper and more inclusive than is represented by the practices and ideas of the contending parties" (LW 13.3).

Contra Rorty, Dewey also suggests that philosophy can go some way toward justifying humanistic values, toward "answering questions like 'Why not be cruel?' and 'Why be kind?'" (quoted in Hickman, p. 18). Dewey says: "The question I would raise concerns why we should prefer democratic and humane arrangements to those which are autocratic and harsh" (LW 13.17). He answers by asking the following:

Can we find any reason that does not come down to the belief that democratic social arrangements promote a better quality of human experience, one which is more widely accessible and enjoyed … ? Does not the principle of regard for individual freedom and for decency and kindliness of human relations come back in the end to the conviction that these things are tributary to a higher quality of experience on the part of a greater number … ? (LW 13.18.)

These answering questions, which make appeal to his theory and criteria of experience, are strikingly though anachronistically responsive to Rorty. What more, Hickman could well ask, does Rorty want?

In a chapter on prospects for global citizenship, Hickman sees a pragmatic emphasis on "human commonality" as more promising than the postmodernists' stressing of "difference and discontinuity." He also figures that the pragmatic method, which he associates with a scientific approach, can foster such commonality even in the face of a commitment to some modest cultural relativism. But Dewey has an alternate route to 'global citizenship'. His commitment to the ideal of sustainable growth of experience guides the way. Cultural differences are then seen as opportunities for rich and varied experiences. Interests held in common are one mark of a desirable society, he contends, but another criterion is co-operative interaction with other groups. (C.f., MW 9.87-106.) If I had to draw an apt Deweyan lesson from such considerations, I'd suggest that good global citizenship might well incorporate many smaller scale varieties of citizenship, membership in many distinctly desirable social groups.

Hickman's extended discussion of technology ranges over an impressive array of post-moderns. His cast of characters includes, as well as Dewey: Habermas, critical theorist Andrew Feenberg and his teacher Marcuse, and "neo-Heideggerian" Albert Borgmann. Throughout these chapters I found myself thinking that Dewey's non-transcendent, humanistic ideal of experiential growth ought to have been deployed in response to many thorny issues -- used foremost as a criterion for what sorts of technology are desirable. Hickman ends this part of the book with an extended quote from Dewey (LW 14.229). The quote contains Dewey's philosophical statement of the democratic faith as "belief in the ability of human experience to generate the aims and methods by which further experience will grow in ordered richness." But Hickman's interpretive emphasis is placed on what the whole, much longer quote has to say about the "interaction between inquiry at its various technological, scientific, and political levels" (p. 126). That interpretative stance is emblematic for me of my main reservation about the book: it overemphasizes Dewey's theory of inquiry at the expense of his theory of experience.

The part of the book devoted to the environment, to "green pragmatism," takes up a number of issues about which Dewey's philosophy has plenty to teach us -- though again, an emphasis on his philosophy of experiential growth would have proved still more instructive about the issues. Of these chapters it may fairly be said that concerns about post-modernism recede into the deep background of the discussion.

The last part of the book is entitled "Classical Pragmatism". The ensuing interpretation of Dewey forces his philosophy into an all too Peircean (and, to a much lesser extent, Hegelian) mold. One gets the impression that -- with the exception of its last chapter -- the final part of the book is just a home for some fugitive essays on pragmatism. For all their potential for illumination and their directing of philosophical attention to neglected Deweyan views, these particular essays do little to advance the post-post-modern pragmatic agenda of the book.

[1] Following Hickman, this citation makes reference to Dewey's Middle Works, volume 9, page 338. So, too, "LW" refers to Dewey's Later Works and "CP" refers to Peirce's Collected Papers.