Pragmatism as Transition: Historicity and Hope in James, Dewey, and Rorty

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Colin Koopman, Pragmatism as Transition: Historicity and Hope in James, Dewey, and Rorty, Columbia UP, 2009, 288pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN: 9780231148740.

Reviewed by David L. Hildebrand, University of Colorado, Denver, and Gregory F. Pappas, Texas A&M University


Surf's up! There's a gnarly new wave rolling towards the shore so grab your surfboards and head out to the water! Even better: it's a wave of Pragmatism! Pragmatism as Transition (hence, Transition) aims to develop a new "wave" of pragmatism, "Transitional Pragmatism" or "Transitionalism." The need for such an alternative is justified, ostensibly, by an "impasse" or "holding pattern" which is paralyzing various contemporary pragmatisms and preventing them from doing "cultural criticism" and helping solve pressing (non-philosophical) ethical and political problems. Transition's basic strategy is to diagnose the impasse by showing a tension between two major historical roots (or "waves") of pragmatism and assessing the strengths and weaknesses of each. Each of these two historical waves of pragmatism reveal, it is argued, various "transitional" elements of their own which can be selectively salvaged for use in the new and improved pragmatism, Transitionalism.

More specifically, the "1st wave" of pragmatism includes American classical pragmatists (CP) C.S. Peirce, William James, and John Dewey, primarily; the "2nd wave" includes figures sometimes called neopragmatists or linguistic pragmatists (NP): Richard Rorty, Robert Brandom, and Hilary Putnam, mainly. Many other figures (pragmatists, non-pragmatists, and others) are enlisted to advance critical and constructive points, with special help coming from Pierre Bourdieu, Stanley Cavell, Bernard Williams, and Michel Foucault. Despite this large and diverse cast, Transition primarily addresses itself to scholars in the American pragmatist tradition; we conclude this because the majority of close analyses (when given) are spent interpreting or criticizing Dewey. (The extent to which we were persuaded by these analyses forms the core of this review.) Nevertheless, we believe that something of interest can be found here for anyone interested in the above mentioned figures, various pragmatisms, or theories regarding genealogy, sociology, or anthropology.

The book consists of seven chapters and an introduction, notes, a bibliography, and an index. The introduction outlines some key terms and then neatly encapsulates the structure and motivation for the book's argument. Chapter 1 explicates the core components of Transitionalism, namely meliorism, historicity, and temporality; chapter 2, called "largely an effort in quotation," seeks to show that "transitionalist" themes characterize "every major pragmatist thinker" (7) as it begins comparing classical and contemporary streams within pragmatism. Chapter 3 labors to establish the necessity of a 3rd wave (Transitionalism) by showing how and why an impasse exists between the first two waves. Arguing that CP is too foundationalist-leaning ("experience-centric") and NP is too narrowly focused on linguistic-practice ("language-centric") the chapter is "concerned to point out certain deficiencies that result from placing too much stress on experience or language rather than on the processes of transitioning in which both experience and language ought to be situated." (8) Chapters 4, 5, and 6 seek to utilize the previous chapters' material by demonstrating how seeing through a "transitioning" lens can relieve longstanding impasses in epistemology, ethics, and political theory (e.g., a solution to the utilitarian/deontology impasse in ethical theory is proffered). Finally, Chapter 7 pleads for much greater attention to genealogical approaches to criticism, such as found in Foucault. These approaches, Transition argues, supply two lacunae in pragmatism: (a) a method for identifying our problems' specific historical roots (rather than focusing too singularly upon consequences, which, it is argued, CP typically does) and (b) a better mechanism for creating problems which stir up thinking -- a.k.a. "problematization." The chapter (and book) ends with a plea for more cross-pollination between genealogical criticism and pragmatism.

Before making further remarks, we wish to identify our perspective -- which Koopman names "classicopragmatism" but which we prefer to simply call "pragmatism." (We apply this label not as a wedge, but because we are unconvinced of the validity of Koopman's taxonomy regarding those working with pragmatist themes.) Whatever the merit of our arguments, we believe Transition has a range and excitement likely to inspire interest and discussion among a variety of audiences beyond pragmatism -- including Rortyans, literary theorists, postmodernists, Foucauldians, and many others -- and so we realize portions of our critique may fail to comment on ideas central to many. We also want to acknowledge the important merit Transition deserves for pointing to and opening a much needed discussion about the disagreement between philosophers that are supposed to share a name and a history. His attempt at diagnosis and treatment are ameliorative -- and welcome.

First, a few words about Transitionalism, whose general account is given in the first two chapters. The basic elements of Transitionalism are, it is argued, already implicit in a variety of pragmatisms and in other views as well. The book chooses apt passages to illustrate moments at which James, Dewey, and Rorty (among others) mention transitions in experience or history (52, 54, 55, 60). Still, what Transitionalism itself is never gets clear enough. As far as we can tell, Transitionalism is supposedly a philosophical "temperament" which intends to pay better attention than previous pragmatisms to lived transitions: "Transitions are those temporal structures and historical shapes in virtue of which we get from here to there" (2). This somewhat cryptic remark about transitions is elaborated upon in a later discussion of Transitionalism, which is a way (we guess) to attend more conscientiously to "historicity" (the contents or particular "how" of experience) and its complement, "temporality" (the processual nature or flowing-ness of experience) (15). Transitionalism also stands in some relation (complementary, we think, but this too is unclear) to "meliorism," the view that "a philosophically robust concept of hope can function as a guide for critique and inquiry." (16) Meliorism is described as a normative philosophical position composed of "pluralism" and "humanism" (19) and so complements the value-neutral Transitionalism.[1] Putting these two things in relation, Koopman writes, "Meliorism is successful transitionalism. Meliorist transitionalism is a philosophical practice of reconstruction. This is as summary a statement of pragmatism that I can muster." (17)

In our view, the relation between Transitionalism and meliorism is unclear. At one point, Koopman seems to equate them, writing "When philosophy itself is interpreted through the lens of these transitionalist notions, it turns out that philosophy is best understood as a theory and practice of hopeful cultural criticism … [which some pragmatists refer to as] meliorism." (16) However, Koopman later marks them as distinct, writing that Transitionalism is "neutral with respect to development and decay" whereas "meliorism, by contrast, clearly connotes something valuable." (17) He then subsumes "melioristic cultural critique" within the broader temporal and historical perspective of Transitionalism. "Meliorism," he writes, "is successful transitionalism." (17) Well, the reader wonders, what is actually true about "transitionalism" and "meliorism"? Are they the same thing or different? Again, it's not clear, for the definition of "pragmatism" (mentioned earlier) makes it seem that pragmatism and meliorism come to the same thing; but a page later Koopman again separates what appeared to be identical, claiming that "it remains to be spelled out exactly how meliorism contributes to pragmatism" (18) and referring to something called "pragmatic meliorism" (18) which he says runs from Emerson, through James and Dewey, to Rorty. However, in a discussion meant to illustrate meliorism (concerned with pragmatic reconstructions of "truth"), Koopman refers to the centrality of "melioration" for "pragmatist transitionalism." Confused? So were we.

Transition's central chapter 3 provides a brief intellectual-historical review of periods or "waves" in American pragmatism (CP and NP). "The first wave of classicopragmatism placed its primary emphasis on the concept of experience. The second wave of neopragmatism placed its primary emphasis on the concept of language." (72) Adding a vague, summarizing gesture (of a sort found, alas, throughout the book) he writes, "This yielded a philosophy of experience and a philosophy of language, respectively. A philosophy of transitions was at best an afterthought in each instance" (72, our emphasis). What exactly are the charges against CP and NP, here?

The charge against CPs like Dewey was that their use ("reliance," "emphasis" -- the verbs vary) of experience in their metaphysics, epistemology, and ethics encouraged them toward tacit acceptance of the trans-experiential "Given" which Wilfrid Sellars warned about. It is not that they explicitly accepted or promoted such things, but rather that their versions of experience (called, variously, "primary experience," "pure experience," or "qualitative firstness," 82) edged their philosophies incautiously close to "a givenism that courts representationalism and foundationalism." (89; see also 75-76) In essence, Koopman has repurposed Rorty's charge against Dewey as a charge against CP in general. The whole lot stinks. (The only difference we can see between Koopman and Rorty is that Rorty explicitly and fully charges Dewey with this -- and sticks to it -- while Koopman alternately issues half-charges and half-retractions.) It is a shame that the CP's conception of "experience" serves as an absolutist backstop, for their processual philosophy was about escaping such foundationalist traps.

Transition's brief against NP (a.k.a. linguistic pragmatism; the movements are never clearly defined) is less severe. NPs like Rorty and Brandom found a way to steer clear of the bad stuff (givenism, representationalism, and foundationalism) using language and "intersubjective conversational consensus" (96) instead of foundational-leaning tropes like CP's "experience." "Rorty saw the linguistic turn as a move toward pragmatism in that it let us stop giving accounts of the experiential grounds of human knowledge and start focusing instead on the sociolinguistic field in which knowledge develops in a self-correcting way" (94). NP went wrong, then, not so much by getting rid of CP's too-thick experience but by substituting a conception of language too-thin to account for our "knowledge practices, ethical practices, and political practices" (100). Without a core concept able to help us understand cultural practices, NP cannot provide tools for cultural criticism able to tackle the thorny issues we face. (Of greater help, in contrast, would be thinkers like Pierre Bourdieu, it is argued.)

Having described the pluses and minuses of these two conflicting waves of pragmatism, Transition renews its discussion of Transitionalism (a focus of Chapters 1 and 2) so it can show that it resolves the impasse between the two waves of pragmatism (supposedly pragmatism's "central problem") and sprint beyond their limitations. Transitionalism promises to utilize a "ready insistence on temporality and historicity" as a way of developing "the core epistemological, ethical, and political insights of pragmatism without reliance on either an experience-centric or a language-centric philosophical framework." (100-101). It is the express purpose of the subsequent chapters (on epistemology, ethics, and political theory) to show Transitionalism at work before concluding, in Chapter 7, with an additional argument that pragmatism needs greater incorporation of genealogical approaches.

Recall that Transition intends to launch a "third pragmatism" that "makes peace" (106), recuperate the "best of both waves of previous pragmatism", and play down the "pernicious elements" of both. Those elements, again, are the "linguisticism" of neopragmatists like Rorty and the "lingering foundationalist tendencies" (106) of James, Dewey, and others following in their footsteps. Serious questions should be raised about Koopman's understanding of the impasse he is trying to resolve. He thinks of his view as a "third wave" because it is not predominantly driven by either language or experience. We believe his analysis of the impasse is superficial because it fails to recognize a more fundamental source of difference dividing the first two waves: it is not a choice between concepts ("language" versus "experience") but rather a difference of metaphilosophical starting points -- a "practical" versus "theoretical" starting point for philosophy. What makes linguistic pragmatism problematic is that it starts, as did modern philosophy, with a theory. While particular theoretical starting points vary (all sensation is atomistic, sensation is categorically non-mental, all experience is linguistic or temporal or historied, etc.), each philosophy starts with something theory-driven and that is what the CPs do not share. Their insistence on the practical starting point ("radical empiricism" is James's term) is what, in our view, sets them apart.[2] For this reason, we have difficulty conceding Koopman's understanding of the impasse. However, we choose to spend the bulk of our time on another premise of his overall argument, that which requires Dewey et al. to be foundationalists, and in a full-fledged way. If that premise fails, no rescue by Transitionalism is needed.

We will defend Dewey against this charge (of foundationalism or something just shy of it) in a moment. First, we feel bound to point out that the charge is never fully-made nor fully-fledged. It is not fully-fledged because CPs like Dewey are never said to embrace foundationalism or givenism; rather, by dint of their "metaphysical-sounding" (202) notion of experience they "warmly invite [givenism's] subtle forms," "risk" foundationalism (86), exhibit foundationalist "tendencies" (87,106) and ultimately fail to show how to "avoid the pitfalls of foundationalism, representationalism, and givenism." (91)[3] Throughout, Transition waffles between condemning CPs as "foundationalists" and exculpating them on extenuating circumstances (e.g., poor choice of words, misjudging their audience, or being born before Wilfrid Sellars could explain the Myth of the Given problem to them).

Regardless of the half-hearted nature of these charges, Transition concludes that they provide sufficient reason to abandon CP: "The pragmatism I am urging is beyond foundationalism because it enables us to see that we need not ground our practical successes in any foundation of experience" (129, our emphasis). Despite endless qualifications, there is, in the end, no uncertainty about. The result is a parody of charity toward CP because while the charges do not really add up, Transition really cannot come to any other conclusion given its ambition to provide a "third wave." It seems that facts have been fixed to suit policy.

In sum, the charges against CP are murky and waffling, made with short passages of little support. We and others have argued that Rorty and Co.'s construal that experience plays a foundationalist role in Dewey is contra-indicated by massive amounts of textual evidence. Whatever one takes experience in Dewey to mean -- and this is no easy issue, we grant -- it is a virtual certainty that it neither implies nor entails a metaphilosophical commitment to foundationalism.[4] Whereas Koopman, Rorty, and Brandom may all agree that Sellars' critique of the myth of the given showed that "experience" is a dispensable concept, we believe the CPs were doing something more than Sellars's critique could obviate. For the target of Sellar's critique is a certain conception of knowledge -- experience in the modern sense; but this is not "experience" in Dewey's dominant sense, namely, the best methodological starting point for a melioristic philosophy in a processual world.

Indeed, the overcoming of modern philosophy's starting point -- subjectivism, if you will -- formed the broadest and firmest basis for agreement among the CPs. The modern, subjectivistic view of experience had, they argued, led to artificial and irresolvable problems, and the promise of pragmatism was to diagnose and dispense with this starting point (and any theories derived from it). Peirce called it "Cartesianism" because he saw it in Descartes (CP5.416); James detected it in atomistic (primarily) British empiricism and calls for a more "radical" empiricism. By the time Dewey comes along, philosophy's failure to identify and eschew the subjective starting point is so stubborn and common that Dewey christens it "the philosophical fallacy" and proceeds to offer more extensive diagnoses and reconstructions than did his predecessors. As mentioned briefly earlier, the problem lies with philosophers' preference to start from a theoretical view of things -- in many cases, that of a subject or spectator set apart from a world-to-be-known. Pragmatism's proposal, then, emblematized in "experience," is to argue that philosophical inquiry start where the philosopher herself starts: amidst concrete, pre-theoretical, everyday experience. Theories will arise, typically to serve inquiries, but they must be returned to experience (to "practice") to provide confirmation.[5]

Over the years, many philosophers have disagreed with the CP's metaphilosophical argument on behalf of a practical or experiential starting point. We are not asserting its truth, merely that it is nothing like foundationalism in philosophical inquiry. While the CPs arrive (empirically, hypothetically) at a general view of experience, this view has nothing to do with "the given." Yes, Dewey struggled to find a better word than "experience" to express his view; nevertheless, he was prolific and emphatic that experience as method is neither erudite nor theoretical but rather "the life [one] has led and undergone in a world of persons and things" (LW 1:369).

Because Transition wishes to speak up for culture and history, we should add that Dewey believed that ordinary experience was not isolated from other people, cultures, or histories; experience is never solipsistic. For Dewey to say that we are in experience or that "individuals live in a world" means "that they live in a series of situations" (LW 13:25; see also LW 12:74). Our experience of things occurs in a contextual whole which is ongoing and horizoned, and it is from such complex contextual wholes that certain qualities and things stand out and are present to us. We never experience the world at large but always from a perspective which is not subjectivistic -- that is, from a particular situation or standpoint (see LW12:72). While it has become fashionable among some philosophers and theorists to hammer in the lesson that language and culture inform the conceptual and perceptual habits of direct experience, this point was not lost on Dewey. He understood that new experiences are "mediated" (if that word must be used) by past conceptual and cultural engagements. As Dewey put it

experience is already overlaid and saturated with the products of the reflection of past generations and by-gone ages. It is filled with interpretations, classifications, due to sophisticated thought, which have become incorporated into what seems to be fresh naïve empirical material (LW1:40).

These accretions -- call them "life experience," in the everyday use of that phrase -- are there at my, your, our starting points of inquiry. They cannot be peeled back or divested to return to something more real or genuine. Thus, Dewey was quite clear that philosophy-as-criticism never utilizes some "given" notion of experience as a foundation guaranteeing knowledge, and he was also clear that philosophy must practice self-criticism along with its critical focus on the problems and issues that matter to us. "We cannot," Dewey writes, "achieve recovery of primitive naïveté. But there is attainable a cultivated naïveté of eye, ear and thought, one that can be acquired only through the discipline of severe thought" (LW1:40). Such criticism of habits is possible, Dewey thought, if we can remain mindful (radically, empirically) of how things initially come across to us -- their "gross, qualitative" character, as Dewey put it. This is not a metaphysical relapse -- it's what the average person calls "keeping an open mind." It is to this lived experience that we can take our recourse, regardless of how convinced we are that even this "given" might be conditioned by personal, historical, and cultural context. All we can do is try our best to cultivate naïveté, according to Dewey.

In sum, we do not find Transition's critique of the CP's concept of experience very convincing. While it is likely that CPs such as Dewey could have used less misleading terms, it is unlikely he could have spilled more ink trying to explain and clarify their meaning. Transition gives us no good reasons, then, to think that abandoning "experience" would significantly advance pragmatism today. Koopman's preferred alternatives -- "transitions," "temporality," "historicity" -- seem as liable to misinterpretation as experience, even after his explications.

We have spent a significant amount of time on "experience" because it is the linchpin of the book. If Transition's critique of "experience" falters, then the book's solution -- Transitional Pragmatism -- is a solution in search of a problem.[6] This is our conclusion. CP did not hold a foundational-leaning view of experience, and so the impasse (as this book describes it) between an "experience-centric" 1st wave and a "language-centric" 2nd wave does not exist, either. There are surely things dividing "classicopragmatists" and "neopragmatists," (such as their metaphilosophical starting points) but Transition does not show how this third wave would provide the necessary next step.

We wish to conclude with a few words of praise. First, we applaud Transition for its ambitions. It tries to synopsize many different movements in philosophy -- various pragmatisms, analytic philosophy, and genealogical approaches -- and then extricate elements common (but often buried) in each so they can contribute to Transitionalism. Its motives are also laudable: (a) to make peace between factions which have much to exchange, but have (in Koopman's view) stopped talking; (b) to synthesize new forms of pragmatism so they can better address cultural problems; and (c) to give future "public intellectuals" new tools to create their culture. Bravo! to all these goals. Second, we think that Transition does an admirable job of bringing out what is of interest to pragmatists in a variety of figures often left unmentioned -- such as Bourdieu, Williams, and Foucault. The continued fecundity of pragmatism depends on scholars like Koopman bringing such "outsiders" into the purview of pragmatists. Finally, we would call attention to the nuanced treatment of Rorty; to pick one example, Transition's summary of Rorty's trajectory as a philosopher was also nicely done (29 ff.).[7] Contemporary philosophers have made a professional sport out of beating up on Rorty, and Koopman reminds us how earnest and genuinely pragmatist Rorty's efforts were to criticize and ameliorate our common future.

[1] Transition's prose is, to our minds, weighed down by too much verbose or jargonistic language. Indeed, given all the jargon, it was odd, to say the least, to hear Koopman remark later in the book (about views he was criticizing), "whatever one thinks of all these ism's, it is undeniable that one of the central aims of every variety of pragmatism is to rid philosophy of them." (120) We can only comment: "change begins at home." Simple "classicopragmatists" that we are, we would prefer merely to say, instead, that pragmatism is a philosophy ever-mindful that "things change all the time" and "we can make things better."

[2] For this different and more metaphilosophical understanding of the impasse triggering Koopman's project see Hildebrand, David L., Beyond Realism and Antirealism: John Dewey and the Neopragmatists (Vanderbilt University Press, 2003), and Pappas, Gregory F., John Dewey's Ethics: Democracy as Experience (Indiana University Press, 2008)

[3] Not only are Dewey and other CPs at risk of foundationalism; so are contemporary classicopragmatists such as R.W. Sleeper, T. Alexander, J. Gouinlock, and R. Bernstein (who is also labeled a "neopragmatist" in the book). However, these contemporary classicopragmatists have far less a reason to fall into foundationalism, given the benefits given to them, Transition argues, by linguistic philosophers like Sellars and Rorty.

[4] See, for example, Hildebrand, 2003 and Pappas, 2008, op cit. n.3. See also Hickman, Larry, Pragmatism as Post-Postmodernism (Fordham University Press, 2007), Tiles, J.E., John Dewey: Political theory and Social Practice, (Taylor & Francis, 1992 ), Alexander, Thomas M., John Dewey's Theory of Art, Experience, and Nature: The Horizons of Feeling (Albany: State University of New York Press, 1987).

[5] We were puzzled by a section in Transition that criticized Dewey's theory of inquiry because it does not explain "where problems come from, how they are generated, and what contribution inquiry itself makes to the recognition of a situation as indeterminate and then problematic." (200) "On Dewey's theory," Koopman complains, "we simply cannot specify where indeterminacies come from insofar as they are the material of raw primary experience. Indeterminacies are, on his view, simply given to us." (200) These comments betray an inadequate understanding of what a situation is for Dewey. He might answer: we encounter situations that trouble us -- we are troubled by them; and only after feeling the trouble is inquiry initiated to characterize such situations (as "problems" of this or that sort) and use hypothesis and action to address them. Koopman's notion that a theory of inquiry must be able to specify in advance where indeterminacies come from puts before inquiry a theoretical test it does not have to take.

[6] Indeed, we have questioned, too, the coherence of this very notion ("transitional pragmatism" or "transitionalism") as well.

[7] However, the comment "most contemporary philosophers tend to read Rorty as little more than a brilliant historian of philosophy" (33) made us scratch our heads. (Our estimate of Rorty is that he was infamous as a provocateur and a proponent of "strong misreadings" of philosophical texts, not as a historian, per se.)