Pragmatism Ascendent: A Yard of Narrative, A Touch of Prophecy

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Joseph Margolis, Pragmatism Ascendent: A Yard of Narrative, A Touch of Prophecy, Stanford University Press, 2012, 200pp., $24.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780804782289.

Reviewed by Michael A. Peters, University of Waikato (NZ)/University of Illinois


In this book Joseph Margolis writes in the grand philosophical style of a Rorty or Derrida. His themes are larger than life; they are the big questions concerning the European connection and the future of pragmatism and philosophy. The book's motto is "the global is never the universal" and it comprises a prologue and three chapters: "The Point of Hegel's Dissatisfaction with Kant"; "Rethinking Peirce's Fallibilism"; and, "Pragmatism's Future: A Touch of Prophecy". What I like about it is that Margolis does not shrink from the difficulties faced by philosophy and philosophers in an age of globalization: as he writes in his Preface,

One must be careful what one says in print but not so careful as to withdraw from convictions that have needed a lifetime to take form. I'm persuaded, for instance that ours is a time for changing cosmologies, political systems, religious allegiances, the touchstones of art and sensibility, and perhaps, at a level of lesser presumption, the orientation of the philosophical canon, if there is a canon to confront. A risky time. (ix)

And with American modesty he confines himself to speaking only about the latter and restoring to philosophy the most reflexive question: "what is it to be a human self" (x). Why are Prefaces often the most informative of attitude and sensibility? By way of the canon and writing books I would like to see the role of Prefaces expanded because they carry the autobiographical details of existential coincidence and occupation often in an intensely personal manner throwing caution to the wind, and this is what I like so much about Margolis in this book. So in the Preface he points towards " a new perspective and a new formulation . . . capable of yielding a new sense of the unity of all our purposes within the limits of natural life within the limits of the natural world" (x). And again, a gnomic utterance that speaks volumes: "philosophy has no point (for me) if it has no convictions about the right orientation of human life" (x) followed by the introduction of an apocalypse: "Notoriously, in our time, this has been taken to signify that philosophy, as standardly practiced, has already come to an end" (x). Margolis, as he directly implies, aims to "reclaim its [philosophy's] proper purpose" (x). See what I mean by Prefaces -- everything has already been said (almost).

So in the Prologue Margolis indicates that this is "the fourth in a trio of books I planned as an overview of pragmatism and American philosophy in the second half of the twentieth century". (What about the first decades of the twenty-first?) The time frame under assessment is modern philosophy as inaugurated by Kant and Hegel with a focus on the nineteenth century pivoting on 1859, the date of Darwin's discoveries and Dewey's birth. Pragmatism's future is set against the "false starts" of logical positivism and French poststructuralism and Margolis casts himself as one of the ushers in a preamble to overcoming the "disarray" in which postwar philosophy finds itself. But why should the trajectory of pragmatism and American philosophy crowd out all other strains and possibilities as though it carries the answer for the world as a whole? I don't understand this theatrical construction unless it is to bring into relief the way of continuing philosophy by "Darwinizing Hegel and Hegelianizing Darwin" (Peirce's banner but a kind of phraseology that also reminds me of Rorty).

When he writes with such gusto and courage the following I am swept along by the sheer narrative force of his work:

I collect these essays in the name of a future pragmatism no longer parochially bound to its American provenance but unwilling to deny its genealogical engine, committed to the naturalism of the motto (and manifesto) just mentioned and, if I may now add, committed to the radical thesis that the self is a hybrid artifact of biological and cultural evolution that makes possible the entire run of the uniquely enlanguaged forms of human intelligence, thought, understanding, reason, feeling, experience, activity, conduct, creation, and knowledge that marks our race for what it is. (6)

A few naïve questions. When we examine the question of the globalization of philosophy are we trying always only to ensure continuity of the European project (properly pragmatized of course!)? Is there an anti-globalization thesis in philosophy or let's say a counter-narrative that is prepared to risk naming the sources of our current "disarray": not just the old "conflict of civilizations" thesis (GHU) or "end of the West" or "the rise of the Rest" or Chimerica but rather a considered response to the relations -- historic, genealogical, contemporary, ethical -- between philosophy and political economy? In particular, the ballooning of finance capitalism and the bankruptcy -- literal, metaphorical and ideological -- of the neoliberal model of capitalist development that cannibilizes its own children and youth?

Don't get me wrong in this review I am highly impressed with the sweep of Margolis' analysis and argument, his erudition, his enlightenment, and the power of his narrative. It's the kind of book I feel an immediate rapport with, except I want to listen to him outside the confines of academic philosophy, to hear his speculations on the work philosophy can do to cure the disorder.

When I read Margolis on the paradox of modern philosophy, of Kant's transcendentialism and how the way of even raising the question is conditioned by inherent human limitations in forms of reasons, then I know I am in the presence of a master. His ability to parse the recent debates (Houlgate's challenge to Pippin, Brandom, Priest) in order to extract the unacknowledged albeit "inchoate pragmatism" beneath the Kant-Hegel canon, leaves me gasping for air.

The second chapter is an analysis that strips off the flesh to expose the skeleton of Hegelian bones that is the material basis for the classic pragmatism of Peirce and Dewey. Margolis offers a reading that takes "Peirce's pragmatism to be the fullest vision of the master themes of classic pragmatism" (53) and provides the means by which to replace representationalism with a form of constructivism while avoiding the notion that reality itself is only our construction. This is a strategy that allows us to hold on to realism and to an independently existing real world (55).

I shan't delay in this review to follow the argument except to say that Margolis embraces T. L. Short's rendition or citation of the "clinching argument" (From MS 318):

The real and living logical conclusion is that habit: the verbal formulation merely expresses it . . . The concept which is a logical interpretant is only imperfectly so. It partakes somewhat of the nature of a verbal definition, and is very inferior to the living definition that grows up in the habit. (5.491) (102)

Pragmatism's future, the subject of the final chapter -- the strong program so to speak -- rests on the possibilities of "Darwinizing Hegel and Hegelainizing Darwin" that encompasses the best of critical philosophy heavily pragmatized, including:

the radical notion of the artifactual self, the unique role of language, the differences between biological and cultural evolution, the analysis of history, and the completely altered expectations of a human world shorn of universalism, essentialism, substantive necessity, apodicity, and any and all privileged sources of cognitive confidence beyond the passing adequacy of self-correcting practical guesses within a largely unknown and inexhaustible world. (120)

When we embrace the full program of this minimalist sense then we have divested ourselves of deep cultural mistakes and presuppositions -- a recuperative effort of Herculean proportions -- then we can naturally embrace the radical historicity of the self and the "cultural achievement of a true language" (126) that favors a kind of naturalism that makes sense of the encultured world including the history and future of philosophy.

In this last chapter, like the previous ones, one can't help feeling the intensity of engagement with Searle and a comfortable assignation with Davidson, with Quine, with Gutting and others that positions pragmatism as the natural heir to analytic philosophy and that places the historicity of the self and human institutions back at the center of philosophy that highlights the possibility, as Margolis says, of "a philosophical spring" (155).

This is a racy tour de force that is compelling, authoritative, spellbinding and leaves the reader asking for more.