Pragmatism: From Peirce and James to Ramsey and Wittgenstein

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Cheryl Misak, Cambridge Pragmatism: From Peirce and James to Ramsey and Wittgenstein, Oxford University Press, 2016, 321pp., $50.00, ISBN 9780198712077.

Reviewed by Claudine Tiercelin, Collège de France


The story of the relationships between certain trends of twentieth-century British philosophy and American pragmatism has, in a sense, been told many times, in books on the history of pragmatism (Thayer 1968), early analytic philosophy (Skorupski 1993), Russell (Vuillemin 1968), Moore (Baldwin 1990), and in many works devoted to Peirce (Hookway 1985), Ramsey (Mellor 1980, Sahlin 1990, Dokic and Engel 2002), Wittgenstein (McGuiness 1985), and the Vienna Circle (Stadler 1997). But Cheryl Misak gives to this familiar narrative a new twist. She concentrates on what happened roughly between 1900 and 1951, and suggests that we take as a key to this period the relationship that the founders of analytic philosophy in the English speaking world had to pragmatism, more precisely, "the relationship between two intellectual giants of Cambridge Massachusetts, Charles Peirce and William James, and two intellectual giants of Cambridge England, Frank Ramsey and Ludwig Wittgenstein" (p.ix).The main objective is to follow the complex philosophical plot of rejections and appropriations of pragmatist ideas by Cambridge during the first part of the twentieth century, and to show that, from several episodes of discoveries of James' and Peirce's ideas, a distinctive brand of British pragmatism emerged, culminating in Wittgenstein's avowal, in his late writings, that he was defending a "kind of pragmatism".

The difficulty of the enterprise is threefold. First, it is quite a challenge to describe the influence of a philosophical movement which is so distinctively American within such a distinctively British academic context. There was, at least from the start, a cultural gap between the early analytic movement at Cambridge and pragmatism, in spite of many common intellectual origins (empiricism, Hegelianism).

Second, it is notoriously hard to pin down the distinctive theses of "pragmatism". Peirce, the founder of the movement, was a metaphysician, a logician and a scientist. Because James took up several of his ideas and gave them a very distinct Jamesian shape and, especially because of the "philistine" twist given to pragmatism by F.C.S Schiller and several Italian pragmatists, Peirce decided to drop the name, and coin a new term: "pragmaticism", "ugly enough to be safe from kidnappers".  Writers such as Dewey, Mead and Morris, took up the label of "pragmatism", but gave it a different turn, too, and today so many writers (from Richard Rorty to Robert Brandom, Huw Price and Michael Williams) have called their views "pragmatist" that it is hard to follow a common thread. Indeed, rather than being a definite set of doctrines, pragmatism is a set of family resemblances between various views. Misak tells us in her preface that "the insight at the heart of pragmatism is that any domain of inquiry -- science, ethics, mathematics, logic, aesthetics -- is human inquiry, and that our philosophical accounts of truth and knowledge must start with that fact" (p.ix). However, this is rather vague, and could just as well characterize such doctrines as empiricism, positivism and existentialism. Adding that pragmatism is a form of naturalism or a form of commonsensism does not help very much either, since by such criteria, Hume, Reid and Moore would turn out to be pragmatists. Later on in her book and in her conclusion, the common pragmatic doctrines are more helpfully (and more classically) characterized as combining a conception of belief as a disposition to act, a conception of truth in its relation to success and to assertion, a fallibilist conception of knowledge as inquiry, and a certain kind of attitude towards ethical and religious matters.

The third difficulty, once these various stances are identified as belonging to the pragmatist movement, mostly with Peirce and James, consists in following the ways in which they have been discussed, modified or rejected by Cambridge philosophers who started from a very different philosophical outlook. According to Misak, the three main actors in these transformations were Russell, Ramsey and Wittgenstein, who, she argues, have all taken on board some of the pragmatist doctrines of Peirce and James, Ramsey being the central character in the plot.

The first part of the book sets the stage. Misak starts her story with synthetic accounts of Peirce's and James's main doctrines, Peirce having been almost ignored in Britain until at least the 1920s, while James was taken for more than two decades as the main representative of pragmatism. Chapter 1 gives us a sort of pocket Peirce, from the pragmatic maxim ("Consider what effects, which might conceivably have practical bearings, we conceive the object of our conception to have. Then, our conception of these effects is the whole of our conception of the object"), to his views of belief as a disposition to act and his account of truth as the end of inquiry. Following views she argued for in the influential Misak 1991, she stresses the ambiguities of Peirce's idea of truth, which oscillates between belief at the end of inquiry as a sort of ideal limit (a regulative ideal in some Kantian sense) and something taken as an actual limit. She points out the role of Bain in Peirce's adoption of belief as a disposition to act, and notes that although Peirce's method of fixation of belief prescribes that beliefs be fixed without necessarily being true, still, they must aim at objective truth and face the pull of reality and facts. A belief is true provided it could not be improved upon and would meet the challenge of further evidence and reasons. She presents a synthetic view of Peirce's conception of categories and of his semiotics, gives a short account of his conception of inquiry, of the logic of science and of induction, and of his views on ethics.

Chapter 2, likewise, gives a synthetic presentation of James, focusing on his views on psychology and his reformulation of Peirce's pragmatic maxim -- "There can be no difference anywhere that doesn't make a difference elsewhere -- no difference in abstract truth that doesn't express itself in a difference in concrete fact and in conduct consequent upon that fact." But this does not yield a theory of truth, although it gives a criterion of truth -- a confusion that Russell was prone to detect (as noted by Haack 1977 and 1984). Misak notes the ambiguities of James's theory of truth, which oscillates between the view most ascribed to him -- that truth is utility, "the expedient of our thinking" -- and a more deflationary view -- truth is what we approve in our judgements. She describes James' s will to believe doctrine, pointing out that it does not entail doxastic voluntarism, but that for a certain class of beliefs, especially religious ones, there are reasons to believe which are not based on evidence (for an influential discussion, see Haack 1997).

Chapter 3 covers much less well-known territory: the "humanism" of F.C.S. Schiller, who was the first native British pragmatist, and whose radical subjectivist views seem to anticipate those of post-modernism: "The world is 'a construction' and truth and reality are 'wholly plastic'", Lady Victoria Welby, who corresponded with Peirce, was probably the first, with C.K. Ogden, to introduce the founder of pragmatism to her British contemporaries, but both she and Ogden were more interested in Peirce's views on semiotics and significs than in his metaphysics or epistemology.

The second part of the book moves to Cambridge UK. Chapter 4 presents Russell's and Moore's revolt against idealism, their early versions of realism, their theories of propositions and judgment, Russell's early version of logical atomism, his correspondence conception of truth and his early theory of knowledge. Their doctrines were quite hostile to pragmatism, which, in his articles of 1908-1909 (Russell 1910) Russell took to be a version of the coherence theory of truth, hence of the Hegelian philosophy which he had fought against in Bradley and McTaggart. Russell's and Moore's attacks on James were, as Misak shows, very influential, and discredited pragmatism for more than two decades in Britain.[1] When Wittgenstein's Tractatus appeared, although some of its doctrines overlapped with pragmatism (in particular with Peirce's and James's views on philosophical method, and with a certain kind of verificationism), its atomism and its picture theory were quite alien to the pragmatist outlook.

The plot thickens in Misaks's narrative when, in chapter 5, she argues that Russell, beginning in 1914, adopted some pragmatic theses, in particular after he visited Harvard, had contacts with Royce, and reviewed some works of Dewey and James on experience and religion. In the Analysis of Mind in 1921, he adopted the pragmatist view that belief is a disposition to act. Chapter 6 is central. It describes how Ramsey, criticizing Russell and Wittgenstein's early views, had numerous references, in his papers, to Peirce, whom he had read in the Cohen collection, Chance, Love and Logic (1923). Misak stresses Ramsey's move towards pragmatism: his rejection of the correspondence theory; his claim, in "Facts and Propositions", that "there is no separate problem of truth but a problem about judgment"; his reliability conception of induction and knowledge; and his views on ethics. She insists, rightly, on the importance of Ramsey's last manuscript, On Truth, and on the fact that he does not hold the kind of "redundantist" theory of truth often attributed to him.

In interesting comments on "General Propositions and Causality", Misak argues that "Ramsey's pragmatism, like Peirce's, holds that our beliefs centrally involve habits, and that we evaluate those habits in terms of whether they serve us well, in a robust sense of 'serve'" (p.199). She ascribes to him a view of truth based on the familiar equivalence 'a belief is true if it is a belief that p, and p' but also on the idea that truth is based on habits which are themselves based on objective facts. She also claims that, in spite of certain expressivist overtones in his views on ethics and religious beliefs, Ramsey was more of a "cognitivist" about such beliefs (p. 214). Ramsey passed the buck of pragmatism to Wittgenstein, who, when he returned to Cambridge in 1929, was very eager to talk with him but was prevented by Ramsey's early death.

Chapter 7 shows how Wittgenstein gave to pragmatism a quite different twist. He read James extensively (Peirce much less) and was unimpressed by the pragmatist's views on norms. He was, also, as it is well known, influenced not only by Ramsey but also by the economist Piero Sraffa, who played a role in his withdrawal from many of his Tractarian positions, in his adoption of the view that meaning is determined by use not truth conditions, and in his rejection of the idea of a "primary language".  He became convinced that "Im Anfang war die Tat" and that practices lay at the foundations of language, meaning and knowledge. His conception of truth oscillates between a kind of quietism and a more assertibilist conception, based on social practices. In her conclusion, Misak draws the various threads of Cambridge pragmatism together.

Many of Misak's analyses are insightful. The overall story that she gives is right and corrects many standard readings of the relationships between American and British pragmatisms. But I disagree with a number of her interpretations. In the first place, I regret that a number of writers who have in the past covered large portions of this territory (e.g. Susan Haack, Christopher Hookway) are not mentioned or hardly mentioned. It would have been interesting to understand why pragmatism took off in Cambridge but not in Oxford. Second, Misak's historical picture of the trends of British philosophy that she examines is often incomplete and shallow. For instance, it would have been interesting to mention the Hegelian context from which both Russell and Moore, on the one hand, and Peirce on the other hand, started. Misak mentions the fact that Peirce started from Kant and the role of Royce, whom Russell met at Harvard, but it would have been valuable to study the idealistic roots of pragmatism. When describing Peirce's views, she hints (p. 37) at the fact that "Peirce was something like a metaphysician" (sic) who defended "tychism and synechism", but she has nothing to say about his realism about universals. This is a pity, not only because she tends to portrait him as a nominalist, but also because the problem of universals (and especially of relations) was to be one of the most attended by Russell and Moore. It was also quite present in Ramsey. But she has nothing to say about Ramsey's views on universals (in his famous 1925 article).

She completely overlooks the role the Darwinian context in England, which played such an important role in the formation of Cambridge philosophers as well as in the development of Peirce's views (there is only a cursory comment on evolutionary love (p. 158)). Indeed, Ramsey was not very impressed by Peirce's metaphysical speculations, but his considerations on belief as habit and on knowledge as reliability were not alien to evolutionary ideas. Darwinism played a large role in the reception of pragmatism in Britain, where the fights over evolution had been -- to say the least -- quite strong, and also because of the problem of universals. This failure to see Peirce as basically a metaphysician and to read his logic and his theory of science and of inquiry as corollaries of his metaphysical views -- and not the reverse -- in my view distorts Misak's otherwise clear accounts of Peirce's theses, and her subsequent gloss on the reception of his ideas by Ramsey and Wittgenstein.

Misak is right to point out the role that his reading of James played in Russell's change of mind about perception and experience after 1914. But it is not clear that the doctrine of belief as a disposition to act, which Misak (following Max Fisch) rightly takes as one of the kernel doctrines of pragmatism, remains the same when it passes from Alexander Bain to Peirce, and then to James, and to Russell and Ramsey. In many ways, the doctrine is present in Hume, who was no pragmatist, but who defended a theory of motivation by desires. Bain defended the doctrine on the basis of a physiological theory of emotions and their relations to the will (1859). It was taken up by Peirce, then by James, who nevertheless emphasized the experiential and mental element in belief. When Russell, during his post-atomist period, defends a "causal" theory of belief in the Analysis of Mind, it is not at all clear that belief is a disposition in spite of the fact that Ramsey calls it "pragmatist". His 1920s view is much more a kind of behaviorism, which eschews the mental elements. Ramsey's view is clearly a dispositionalist view, as his theory of variable hypotheticals entails.

Many writers in Mellor 1980, as well as other commentators, have claimed that Ramsey's view of belief is closer to a form of functionalism in the style of David Lewis and contemporary philosophers of mind. Functionalism is a kind of dispositionalist view indeed, but it has different implications about the nature of the mind, in particular with respect to mind-body identity. Ramsey clearly intended to connect it to a Bayesian theory of degrees of belief, which was part and parcel of his pioneering version of decision theory and of his subjective theory of probability. Peirce, however, was more of a frequentist (and then, a "would-be-ist" or "propensionist") about probabilities, and he held no subjective theory of degrees of belief. Neither did Russell. Moreover, it is by no means obvious that the Russell of The Philosophy of Logical Atomism and later on maintains such a dispositionalist view of belief. Totally absent from Misak's account are the views of Russell in his Inquiry on Meaning and Truth (1940), and his stern rejection there of Dewey's assertibilist conception of truth. If he had been tempted by pragmatism, how could have he written his chapter against Dewey and James? When one reads his later writings, such as his article on Dewey in the latter's Schilpp volume (Russell 1923) and in his A History of Western Philosophy, one can see that his animadversions against pragmatism are still very strong and that he repeats his 1908-1909 objections to James. So it's not obvious at all that Russell moved to pragmatism in the 20s.

Thus, Ramsey remains -- possibly with his friend Richard Braithwaite -- the only Cambridge philosopher whose views were close to Peirce, but not, as Misak correctly shows, to James. She rejects (p. 170) as dubious the attribution to Ramsey of a "success semantics" (Mellor 2012, Whyte 1990, Dokic and Engel 2002), namely, the view that a belief's truth-conditions are those that guarantee the success of an action based on that belief, whatever the underlying motivating desires, because such a view, according to her, ignores the "objective factors" of belief and the mental factor, and amounts to a form of behaviourism. But, first, it is not clear what role the mental factor has for Ramsey, if it supposed to be a kind of experience, for he famously says in "Truth and Probability": "The beliefs that we hold most strongly are often accompanied by no feeling at all." Second, she objects, quoting Blackburn (2005) and Rumfit (2011) that Ramsey could not be a success semanticist because he does not say that the truth of a belief guarantees successful action, and that he is not open to the objection that false beliefs can be successful. But these are precisely the commitments that Mellor (2012) and Dokic and Engel (2002) are careful to ascribe to Ramsey, formulating success semantics in terms of a holistic, not a causal, account of belief.

Misak rightly notes that interpreters have been misguided when they attributed to Ramsey a "redundantist" theory of truth, understood as the view, once defended by J.L. Mackie (1972) and C.J.F. Williams (1976), that the truth predicate can be eliminated. Indeed, he was probably closer to a deflationist conception according to which "a belief is true if it is a belief that p, and p" (p.205). However, she does not mention that Ramsey was concerned by the propositional quantification that worried redundantists (in "Facts and Propositions"). She also makes much of Ramsey's famous remark (in the same article) that "there is no separate problem of truth, but only a problem about judgement, or assertion." But she seems to interpret this at times in a strictly deflationist fashion (there is nothing more to the truth that P than the assertion or judgement that P) and at times as the view that truth is assertibility, which is indeed a pragmatist doctrine, but of a more Deweyan kind. Clearly, Ramsey recognised the normative nature of belief and truth (beliefs aim at truth), but it is not clear whether Misak claims that, like Peirce, he thought that truth is what is reached at the end of inquiry.

Misak has an interesting discussion on Wittgenstein about truth, viewing him as oscillating between a quietist view and a conception of truth as based on human agreement, and as suggesting that the agreement is not relative to communities (in the sense of a form of relativism), but is in some sense universal (p.255). But it is hard to see how such a view would amount to a realist theory of truth in the style of Peirce's (if Peirce was a truth-realist at all). She also neglects the fact (much emphasized by Marion (1998) and others) that Wittgenstein was a finitist in mathematics, and that Ramsey at the end of his life was close to such a view.

In her conclusion, Misak outlines the kind of pragmatism that, according to her, is common to the writers she discusses:

There is a sophisticated pragmatism that ought to be at the forefront of contemporary philosophical debates about truth, rational belief, and knowledge. That pragmatism is a kind of amalgam of Peirce and Ramsey. It starts with the idea that a belief is in part a habit or a disposition to behave. A belief must have consequences or expectations of whatever sort are relevant to the particular domain of inquiry in question. This kind of pragmatism then proceeds to ask what it is to evaluate beliefs, and the answers will be different for different kinds of beliefs -- scientific, mathematical, ethical, general, counterfactual, and so on. Inquiry is unified, objectivity is preserved, and beliefs and ways of life are criticizable. Plenty of questions remain for this kind of pragmatist, but the benefits are clear. For instance, there is no begging the question against value judgements being aimed at truth, and there is an answer to the sceptic or relativist who would focus on the human nature of belief and inquiry in order to argue that there is no truth and objectivity to be had at all. (p. 286)

Many readers who have broad sympathies for pragmatism will agree with such an ecumenist view. Even the writers who have identified themselves as "pragmatists" in the past, such as American philosophers like Dewey, Mead, Rorty or Brandom will agree that beliefs are dispositions, that they are assessable, that our beliefs can be rational, evaluable, and that truth has to be in some sense objective. Only the likes of F.C.S. Schiller, or of those postmodernists who identify pragmatism with various forms of subjectivism and relativism will find such a Peirce-Ramsey line uncongenial. But it was not clear to me what exactly this "sophisticated pragmatism" amounted to. As a theory of truth, it seems to waver between a form of deflationism and what Misak calls a "more robust" theory of truth (p.223). However, it is unclear what this more robust view would be. It is not a mere reduction of truth to utility or success, for it has, Misak says, to take into account "facts" (although not in the correspondence sense). But we are not told how. She is right to point out that pragmatism can be understood either as global or as partial (namely, that we should accept, like Blackburn, that some of our judgments are truth apt but that a number of others, in ethics in particular, lend themselves to an expressivist treatment). She suggests that pragmatism had better be "global" (apparently referring to Huw Price's version of this view), but it is doubtful that all of the writers analysed in the book defend such a global pragmatism. It would, of course, be unfair to suppose that Misak has in any sense tried to articulate in detail, rather than hinted at, what such a sophisticated pragmatist view could be. But when one closes the book, one even wonders what it has been.


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[1] An important episode in the story of Russell’s relationships with pragmatism that is missing from Misak’s narrative is his polemic against Bergson--who was considered the main defender of William James on the continent. Susan Stebbing was more a London than a Cambridge philosopher, but she also fought Bergson, and did so in the names of Russell and Moore. See Stebbing 1914.