Pragmatism, Kant, and Transcendental Philosophy

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Gabriele Gava and Robert Stern (eds.), Pragmatism, Kant, and Transcendental Philosophy, Routledge, 2016, 297pp., $116.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138791916.

Reviewed by Vincent Colapietro, Pennsylvania State University


The aim of this volume is to explore critically the connections between American pragmatism and transcendental philosophy in a strict Kantian sense. Thirteen finely crafted essays follow a substantive "Introduction" by the editors. The range of concerns explored is, in a sense, somewhat narrow (also the range of classical pragmatists considered), with only one essay being devoted to political philosophy (David Macarthur's "A Kantian-Inspired Vision of Pragmatism as Democratic Experimentalism") and one to some extent concerned with moral philosophy (Boris Rähme's "Transcendental Argument, Epistemologically Constrained Truth, and Moral Discourse"). In terms of figures, the tilt is decisively toward Peirce, with Dewey, Mead, Lewis mostly pushed to the margins. James hovers between the center and fringe of the contributors' consciousness.

The majority of the contributors focus on what broadly might be identified as epistemological concerns (Gabriele Gava's "The Fallibilism of Kant's Architectonic," Cheryl Misak's "Peirce, Kant, and What We Must Assume," Daniel Herbert's "Peirce and the Final Opinion: Against Apel's Transcendental Interpretation of the Categories," Jean-Marie Chevalier's "Forms of Reasoning as Conditions of Possibility: Peirce's Transcendental Inquiry Concerning Inductive Knowledge," Marcus Willaschek's "Kant and Peirce on Belief," James R. O'Shea's "Concepts of Objects as Prescribing Laws: A Kantian and Pragmatist Line of Thought," and to some extent Wolfgang Kuhlmann's "A Plea for Transcendental Philosophy"). But one of the contributors focuses on freedom (Robert Stern in "Round Kant or Through Him? On James's Arguments for Freedom, and Their Relation to Kant's"), another on consciousness (Graham Bird's "Consciousness in Kant and William James"), and yet another on subjectivity (Sami Pihlström's "Subjectivity as Negativity and as a Limit: On the Metaphysics and Ethics of the Transcendental Self, Pragmatically Naturalized"). While bearing significantly on epistemological concerns, the two concluding essays (Kuhlmann's "A Plea for Transcendental Philosophy" and Rähme's "Transcendental Argument, Epistemically Constrained Truth, and Moral Discourse") are best characterized as meta-philosophical exploration.

The volume opens with Sebastian Gardner's "German Idealism, Classical Pragmatism, and Kant's Third Critique". The pieces are for the most part not strictly historical, but intricate elaborations of what an imagined form of philosophical pragmatism or transcendental philosophy would look like. But these constructions appear to be rooted in an intimate familiarity with historical figures and specific writings. Moreover, some of the pieces (especially those by Gardner, Misak, Stern, and Bird) are painstakingly historical. The title of Macarthur's contribution might be taken as indicative of the spirit pervading this collection, with the exception of Misak's truly exquisite essay: these are Kantian-inspired interpretations and reconstructions. Her account of Peirce takes more seriously than all of the other contributors the efforts of classical pragmatism (more precisely, a particular pragmatist) to distance itself from transcendental modes of philosophical inquiry. Even Misak's contribution, however, highlights the affinity between pragmatism and Kantianism. She does note, "Peirce spends precious little ink on trying to get Kant straight" (p. 90). One might say this about all of the other pragmatists, with the exception of C. I. Lewis. The contributors to n effect seem to be devoted to rectifying this. Indeed, most of the essays read as briefs against pragmatism insofar as it has allegedly failed to grasp the fine detail and full import of Kant's transcendental turn.

At the conclusion of an extremely impressive essay, Gardner stresses: "What separates the two developments [from Kant's Critique of Judgment] at their historical root is . . . their attitude to apriority," rather than their stance toward Kant's conception of regularity. In his transcendental logic, Kant is of course an apriorist. "Peirce's ab initio commitment to exclusively a posteriori grounds of knowledge precludes his taking the path to objective idealism".  But this leads to a question. "Among the many systematic [rather than merely hermeneutic or historical] questions we are left with is that of whether Peirce, following an a posteriori path, succeeds in making the transition from the purposivity of human cognition to a conception of purposivity as a wholly general ontological structure" ((p. 40).  The implication seems clear: Peirce the pragmatist might lack what only Kant the apriorist can provide. At the conclusion of the penultimate essay (I wish it had been the final one since it would make for a neater story!), Kuhlmann readily acknowledges: "The presented philosophy bets on ultimate justification and infallibility." It does so not because "it has fallen in love with security" or for other less than admirable or questionable motives. It does so because we reasonably can demand of philosophers an account of their own undertaking: "that philosophers can . . . understand their own activity as rational in the sense of explicitly and legitimately maintaining their own positions, is something one should expect from philosophers" (p. 256). This supposedly drives us in the direction of ultimate and infallible foundations, only obtainable by transcendental arguments. This would have been a fitting conclusion for this volume, since transcendental foundationalism is celebrated here as having trumped anti-foundationalist pragmatism, especially of the Rortyean stripe. (Short) Readers of Peirce might be reminded of an interjection in a dialogue on pragmaticism: "Have the gracious gods confined us to two alternatives?" (Collected Papers, 5.500). From the perspective of most of the authors in this volume, the good news is Kant can save us from Rorty, even more generally save pragmatism from itself. For some of us, however, such salvation comes at far too high a price.

In any event, Peirce would count most of the authors assembled here to be among "the starry host of Kant's progeny" (Essential Peirce, volume 2, p. 400). Formally, these papers are exemplary. Their authors manifestly honor the ideals of clarity as well as (albeit with a crucial qualification) probity, erudition, and rigor. Substantively, these essays are without exception informative, insightful, and suggestive. But they are not fully what the editors of this volume advertise them to be. The editors emphatically assert that the collection investigates the relationship among "pragmatism, Kant, and current Kantian approaches to transcendental arguments in a detailed and original way" (emphasis added). The claim to originality of these approaches is overblown. After all, none other than Murray G. Murphey published in the third volume of the Transactions of the Charles S. Peirce Society (i.e., in 1973) an article entitled "Kant's Children: The Cambridge Pragmatism." In fact, this approach antedates by at least several decades Murphey's article and, moreover, has been a dominant current in the critical engagement with American pragmatism virtually from Peirce's day to our own. Concerning the narrower topic of transcendental pragmatism, especially as this approach has been ingeniously proposed and doggedly defended by Karl-Otto Apel, we might recall C. B. Christensen's "Peirce's Transformation of Kant," an article published in The Review of Metaphysics in 1994. But this is only one essay in a far from insignificant number of pieces in which an interpreter tries to show how Peircean pragmatism is in effect a transcendental project. In light of this, informed readers will not be persuaded of the originality of this volume.

What is however most disappointing about this collection is the almost complete absence of truly critical views. No Rortyean voice is to be heard among the assembled chorus and, worse, no pragmatist who is deeply skeptical of reading the pragmatist position as one in need of transcendental justifications, arguments, of "foundations." Those who take the pragmatists at their word--for example, Peirce in his later characterization of Kant's first Critique as "the very chimæra of the history of philosophy, according to the tongues of fame  . . .  but in reality nothing more portentous than a sickly little nannygoat masquerading as a world-shatterer" [MS 609: 10; quoted in Fisch 1986: 257])--are in effect dismissed as "superficial" (p. 2). No one would ever claim that classical pragmatism and Kant's critical project are "in complete opposition" (description on page preceding the title page), though many of us tend to think the obsessive focus on this particular connection occludes some of the most important facets of the pragmatist orientation. Indeed, Rorty is more right than wrong when he identifies Kant as not the way out but the all too seductive entrance back into the modernist labyrinth. Consider, for a moment, Kant's claim at the beginning of the first Critique that hypotheses are contraband in philosophy. Is it superficial to imagine that the pragmatists have a radically different understanding of philosophical inquiry than that of the a priorist Kant? (Cf. however Chevalier and Willaschek in the volume under review.) Of course, what Kant lays out in later chapters (e.g., "The Architectonic of Pure Reason" and "The History of Pure Reason") can and, in fact, did inform the work of thinkers such as Peirce and Dewey who were convinced that hypotheses are anything but contraband in philosophy or anywhere else. Conjectures are indeed the only means responsible inquirers have at their disposal. Perhaps like Sherlock Holmes some philosophers might insist, "I never guess," I only produce demonstrative arguments based upon incontrovertible premises, but Peirce, James, Dewey, and Mead would judge such philosophers to suffer from methodological self-deception, a malady for which pragmatism in the form most recognizable to me was designed to remedy.

For the sake of argument, however, let us grant transcendental pragmatists their seemingly unshakable confidence in their philosophical stance. After all, whenever competent persons disagree, this itself makes it clear, Peirce suggests, that the matter is practically dubious. If those pragmatists or interpreters of pragmatism turn to the task of editing a volume devoted to exploring the connection between pragmatist and transcendental approaches, they ought to include those who are radically skeptical of (what these skeptics cannot help but judge to be) the high-flown pretensions of transcendental approaches. Otherwise the overarching ideal of "dialogical rationality," an ideal at the very heart of pragmatism, has been desecrated (Richard J. Bernstein, The New Constellation, pp. 48-49). Imagine a collection of essays in which Catholic theologians debate with every appearance of intellectual candor and genuine self-criticism the Lutheran position on the relationship between faith and works. Actually, it is almost impossible to imagine such a volume being undertaken at this time. The Catholic theologians would have had the good sense to invite at least a Lutheran or two to join the critical debate, in order that the debate might be truly critical. Things are, alas, different in professional philosophy. Implicit orthodoxy tends to be stricter than explicit.

There is an important methodological point here. We might recall Peirce's all too demanding ideal of what any responsible inquirer ought to do when commencing a genuine investigation into the truth of a controverted topic. That person "should make a complete survey of human knowledge" (6.9). Short of that, this individual should make as wide a survey as finitude allows. In this volume, however, there tends to be too often only a ritualistic acknowledgment of a contrary position and, worse, an apparent lack of an intimate familiarity with rival traditions.[1] As a result, there is an insufficiently critical stance toward Kant's critical philosophy.

German scholars have a right to complain when Anglophone interpreters of, say, Kant or Hegel take little or no account of the immense, rich tradition of German scholarship. Is it valid then for an American scholar to issue an analogous complaint about certain European takes on classical pragmatism? In order to appreciate the spirit, not merely understand the letter, of the pragmatists, perhaps Max H. Fisch, John E. Smith, John J. McDermott, Richard J. Bernstein, Joseph Ransdell, T. L. Short, Sandra B. Rosenthal, Nathan Houser, and, yes, Rorty are far from negligible.

Pragmatists take themselves to be committed to an ideal of criticism, above all self-criticism, owing something to Kant but also to a host of other predecessors. Hence, at least at a very high level of generality, there is an undeniable kinship with Kant's critical project. But Kant's critical philosophy is, from their perspective, only one variant of a critical orientation and the critique of the very form and ideals of criticism is central to their philosophical self-understanding. Their ideal of critique is, I submit, one in which relentless, immanent, and ongoing criticism of our historically evolved and evolving practices is alleged to be sufficient unto the day. Makeshift, revisable justifications, in the inherently disconcerting circumstances of our historical existence, are either the best we can ever do or the best we are ever likely to achieve. While understandable, the impulse to jump outside of the onrushing course of human history and, thereby, to reach a transcendental perch might be neither possible nor desirable. Might pragmatists be children of Vico rather than progeny of Descartes,[2] hence thinkers standing in a lineage including Hegel, Marx, Freud, R. G. Collingwood, Oreta y Gasset, John William Miller, and Bernard Williams? Might Kant in this regard be the illegitimate offspring of a noble apriorist and an unabashed historicist who refuses to apologize for consorting with historical contingencies and unavoidable revision, while her son is so embarrassed by his historicist mother that he embraces all too tightly the manners of his apriorist father?

What is most admirable and simultaneously most frustrating about this volume is, to some extent, epitomized in the contribution to it by one of the editors: Gava's "The Fallibilism of Kant's Architectonic." The piece is admirable in its clarity, organization, and sharply focused attention to the most salient details, and also admirable in the care with which a very complicated argument is laid out in the most compact, cogent form the complexity of the matter and (in my judgment) dubiety of the conclusion permit. That conclusion is announced, or at least implied, in the title itself: Kant is a fallibilist or, better, Kant can be read as a fallibilist in a sense close to, if not identical with, Peirce's understanding of this position. Despite appearances, fallibilism does not mark a divide between Kant and Peirce, between the transcendental approach defended by the author of the Critique of Pure Reason and the seemingly anti-transcendental pragmatism championed by Peirce. Some might find Gava's argument compelling. Others who read pragmatism as more of a departure from, than a continuation of, Kant would be far from convinced. Is this admirable sophistication or tortuous ingenuity enlisted in a desperate effort to square the circle? In any event, a pragmatist would certainly draw back from this conclusion and ask, what is its import? It seems to be that the logic of Gava's argument drives us in the direction of christening not only Kant but also Descartes as a fallibilist. While the Kantian might step back from the argument and admire the formal elegance of its intricate architecture, a pragmatist would suspect that it is unwittingly a reductio ad absurdum. If by the logic of this argument even Descartes counts as a fallibilist, there surely must be something wrong with the argument!

What's the use of calling pragmatism a variant of Kant's project[3] and, in turn, what's the use of identifying Kant as a proto-pragmatist? This volume is, in fact, a contribution to a long-standing and ever-widening tradition of hermeneutic engagement and critical appropriation. It is certainly admirable in its detail of argumentation, if not its originality. It advances the cause of that tradition, in suggestive and illuminating ways. But what Max H. Fisch wrote over thirty years ago needs to be recalled: by 1894, Peirce had "read and thought more about Aristotle than about any other man" (MS 1604, quoted in Fisch 1986, 240). Fisch, Ransdell, and Short are immensely helpful in reading Peirce as an Aristotelian, thus a philosopher more at odds with Kant than virtually all of the contributors to this volume seem to appreciate. Is it not richly ironic that the partial origins of pragmatism in German thought are so frequently allowed to eclipse the dramatic outcome -- the decisive turn away from the transcendental turn? In any event, Peirce increasingly turned to the medieval schoolmen and, even more fully, to the individual whom they referred to as "the Philosopher." Peirce was more an Aristotelian and Hegelian than he was a Kantian.

The conservative character of so much professional philosophy, so bemoaned by Dewey, is nowhere more apparent than in the questions to which we obsessively return and the canonical positions highlighted on the traditional maps on which we narrowly focus. What if we turn to pragmatism not primarily as a source of novel answers to traditional questions, but as an inspiration for novel questions, even ones not yet articulated (still elusive and inchoate)? And what if we take the pragmatist conception of historical emergence with the utmost seriousness, readily conceding that emergent phenomena are always continuous with certain facets of the historical circumstances out of which they flow, but adamantly insisting that they almost always an irreducible novelty? In particular, what if we take philosophical pragmatism itself to be such an emergent phenomenon, hence not one reducible to (although of course continuous with) some dominant feature of their antecedent conditions?

Rorty was right. Classical pragmatism was a radical departure from traditional philosophy (a radical but not a complete departure). He might have been partly wrong in identifying the respects in which it diverged from the dominant tradition or the implications of this divergence, but he, like Fisch, Smith, McDermott, Bernstein, Ransdell, Short, and a host of others, was right in taking American pragmatism to be a game changer. With several notable exceptions, this is what the contributors to Pragmatism, Kant, and Transcendental Philosophy fail to appreciate.

[1] See, e.g., John E, Smith's "The Reflexive Turn, the Linguistic Turn, and the Pragmatic Outcome" (reprinted in America's Philosophical Vision) or my "Telling Tales Out of School: Pragmatic Reflections on Philosophical Storytelling" (Journal of Speculative Philosophy, 27, 1, 1-32).

[2] Kant is at least as much Cartesian as the pragmatists are allegedly Kantian. He continues what Dewey disparaged as the quest for certainty. There are those who have been weaned from the breast of this ideal and, alas, those who have not.

[3] One of the seemingly more mundane uses is the opportunity for funding (see the Acknowledgments to this volume). The German government has handsomely funded the research for this project. The material conditions for our intellectual endeavors deserve critical consideration. While I feel deep misgivings about noting this, I feel even greater ones about lacking the courage to point this out. The possibility that the direction of our research is shaped not only by an immanent dialectic of intellectual history but also external conditions is one to which a pragmatist is especially attuned.