Pragmatism, Objectivity, and Experience

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Steven Levine, Pragmatism, Objectivity, and Experience, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 270pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781108422895.

Reviewed by Robert Kraut, The Ohio State University


Steven Levine has written a superb book. The title advertises three perennially puzzling topics: pragmatism, objectivity, and experience. Some background will help locate his project on a larger map.

Precise specification of pragmatism would be useful, but difficult to provide: a wide variety of views tend to appear under the pragmatist rubric. Frequently it involves little more than homage paid to the work of James, Peirce, and/or Dewey. More robust versions stress doctrinal and/or methodological views about truth and reference (e.g., the rejection of truth-as-correspondence-to-reality, or a more thoroughgoing deflationism about semantic discourse); other versions foreground the primacy of institutional norms, the impossibility of epistemically privileged representation, the significance of justificatory holism, rejection of the Enlightenment tradition built upon the pursuit of objective truth, the epistemic credentials of intuitions, and/or the folly of seeking to "ground" institutional practices in facts about confrontations with ontological realities which somehow "make normative demands" upon participants. There might also be a historically-grounded dispute as to whether 'pragmatism' names a substantive ontological doctrine or a methodological canon.

Obviously, there are objects and properties constraining human practice; pragmatism is not idealism. Pragmatists puzzle about the nature of such constraint: after all, the world does not tell us how to think about it; nor does it offer us reasons. The world is mute. The pragmatist seeks to understand the human condition by exploring the fabric of inferential connections and institutional practices associated with any given stretch of discourse, rather than by privileging correspondence relations with objects. Speech act theory becomes the dominant paradigm, as opposed to Frege-Tarski-Carnap referential semantic approaches.

Likewise: precise specification of objectivity would be useful, but difficult to provide. Frequently it signals those aspects of a mind-independent world that push back on our conventions and institutional practices; disputes emerge about whether such pushback is purely causal, or rather a normative, authoritative force to which we are answerable. Pragmatists might wish to switch the question from "What is objectivity?" to the expressivist question "What are we doing when we attribute objectivity?". And here there is room to maneuver: perhaps talk of objectivity signals the legitimacy of giving and asking for reasons and justifications as part of an ongoing effort to achieve consensus in the face of diverse perspectives. Or perhaps such talk plays a quite different role. At the extreme, one might question -- as Rorty is alleged to have done -- the very legitimacy of the concept of objectivity and/or the utility of its continued deployment. Perhaps we do better with a notion of social solidarity. But perhaps not.

Likewise: precise specification of experience would be useful, but difficult to provide. Familiar disputes loom about the nature, content and justificatory power of experience, whether experience is sufficiently rich to provide an adequate source for the acquisition of certain concepts, and whether what is "given" in experience is of propositional form, thereby providing foothold for inferential relations between experience and belief. Insofar as various forms of empiricism demand rational connections between experience and judgment, questions loom about the nature of such rationality and the capacity of experience to sustain it. Insofar as 'experience' signals qualitative, phenomenological, sensory-perceptual states, one wishes to know whether representation is essential to their nature, and how -- if at all -- such states figure into the normative space of reasons.

Different notions of experience populate the marketplace: ranging from experience as momentary episodes of lived conscious awareness (itches, pains and sense-impressions of red triangles serve as paradigms), to experience as reflective problem solving: "a temporally extended learning process that involves both conscious and nonconscious states and episodes" (12). This contrast -- often signaled as that between Erlebnis and Erfahrung -- requires considerable commentary, and hardly exhausts the possibilities. Moreover: insofar as there is more to experience than sensory-perceptual responses to stimuli, one wants to know how much more, and where it comes from.

Rorty says of his Consequences of Pragmatism that "The essays in this book are attempts to draw consequences from a pragmatist theory about truth."[1] In contrast, Levine's book foregrounds the concept of objectivity, and in terms of it seeks to articulate various strains of pragmatist thought about experience and justification. His study is well-informed, richly detailed, systematically elegant and philosophically insightful.

Levine's book provides an admirably detailed survey of pragmatist views and arguments concerning the concept of objectivity: its legitimacy, source, and content. His basic strategy is to diagnose pragmatist concerns by showing that they rest upon an impoverished conception of sensory experience, and then recommend a richer notion of experience relative to which the problems disappear -- thus restoring the notion of objectivity to legitimacy. The strategy is analogous to arguing that Hume's skepticism about causation is grounded in too thin a notion of experience and its contents, and countering the skepticism by advocating that conscious experience delivers verdicts not only about succession and regularity, but about causal necessity as well. Armed with such experiential enrichment, the Humean projectivist machinery loses its motivational appeal. Thus, questions about the legitimacy of a concept often rest upon assumptions about what, precisely, is given in experience. Here we need a reminder of what is at stake when the concept of objectivity is on trial.

We wish to say -- in our pre-analytic innocence -- that there is an objective, mind-independent world -- much of which is the way it is regardless of human interests, goals, cognitive/perceptual capacities, and research agendas. We aspire to write the Book of the World correctly; we aim for descriptions that are adequate to the way the world is. To this extent, some form of realism is correct. The pragmatist denies none of this, but fears that the deployed notions of adequacy and correctness are somehow problematic. One way to appreciate Levine's contribution is to retrace the steps that lead to this fear.

A route into the dialectic begins with Wilfrid Sellars' widely discussed attack on "the Myth of the Given."[2] Sellars' qualms about inner episodes which play both a causal role in the acquisition of knowledge and a justificatory role in the grounding of knowledge play a major role in Rorty's arguments for a certain form of eliminative materialism. These arguments, when extended beyond the domain of sensations, encourage qualms about the very idea of objectivity.

Thus we begin with the Myth of the Given. This is the view, regarded by Sellars as an essential pillar of empiricism, that there are self-authenticating, non-verbal episodes which consist of non-mediated encounters with objects (e.g., phenomenal contents), the authority of which encounters is transmitted to the judgments which express them. Sellars finds problematic the idea that epistemic authority can flow from mere confrontation with an object -- phenomenal or otherwise. His target is the idea that there exists a domain of facts such that

(1) each such fact is non-inferentially known to obtain;

(2) each instance of knowledge of such facts presupposes no other knowledge;

(3) the non-inferential knowledge directed toward such facts is "the ultimate court of appeals" for all factual claims.

The problem is that there is, according to Sellars, no kind of knowledge which presupposes no other bit of knowledge; justification is holistic, and the legitimacy of any judgment demands the legitimacy of others. Reports of non-inferential confrontations with experiential objects deploy concepts, recognitional skills, etc.; such factors, in turn, provide basis for justificatory challenges to the reports. Thus, the alleged encounters with phenomenal contents cannot themselves confer positive justificatory status upon reports. There can be no self-authenticating descriptions of incorrigibly grasped episodes; for such descriptions would have non-holistic justificatory status, and Sellars regards that as impossible.

It is a complex, profound and controversial story. Relevant here is the way it ramifies in Rorty's hands, extending from the subjective to the objective. Here the background is again vital.

Rorty's early arguments for his brand of eliminative materialism draw heavily upon Sellars' indictments of the given.[3] In response to objections that elimination of folk-psychological in favor of neurobiological vocabulary would fail to accommodate the given, directly experienced character of sensory-perceptual episodes, Rorty notes that the notion of adequacy deployed in such objections is vacuous.

More specifically: the reduction of psychology to neurobiology cannot be successfully blocked by a priori reflection on the nature of the episodes of which psychology speaks (viz., sensations, beliefs, desires, etc.) and the nature of pre-linguistic confrontations with phenomenal contents. For if you insist that any linguistic/conceptual resources capable of capturing facts about awareness must be somehow adequate to the awareness, you run afoul of the Sellarsian idea that

'adequate to' is an empty notion. There is no criterion for the adequacy of a bit of language to a bit of non-linguistic awareness. Indeed, the notion of a non-linguistic awareness is simply a version of the thing-in-itself -- an unknowable whose only function is, paradoxically enough, to be that which all knowledge is about. What does exist is the causal conditions of a non-inferential report being made. But there is no unique vocabulary for describing these causal conditions. There are as many vocabularies as there are ways of explaining human behavior.[4]

But if "adequate to" is an empty notion in the domain of sensations, then so is the notion of a description or theory being adequate to the external world. It is not clear what it would be for a theory to capture the way the world is, because the very notion of capture, and the idea of the world being a certain way -- so as to warrant certain descriptions and delegitimize others -- has been shown to be vacuous.

So goes the argument. Against this backdrop Levine carefully reviews and assesses Brandom's contributions in the area, arguing that Brandom's and Davidson's communicative-theoretic accounts of objectivity, which rest upon norms instituted in conversational practice, provide insufficient resources for a sufficiently rich notion of objectivity. In its place -- or as an adjunct -- Levine advocates an experiential theoretic account, which he claims to provide a better foothold for the idea that we are, in some sense, normatively constrained by, and thus answerable to, the world.

Levine provides rich historical background and rigorous argumentation at every turn. His scholarly attention to detail is admirable: critical discussions of work by Rorty, Sellars, McDowell, Misak, Brandom, and Davidson are extremely helpful, enabling those outside the pragmatists loop to appreciate their respective positions on the larger map.

The key idea -- which Levine traces to Dewey and James -- is that experience itself already contains elements of rationality, habits, coping and problem-solving, thereby furnishing materials for a notion of objective constraint: a world that pushes back on our problem-solving efforts. That is: normativity, regarded by recent neo-pragmatists as an artifact of social-institutional coordination, is found within experience itself. Normativity, one might say, is implicit in experience, thereby providing basis for solving the problems. It is, Levine urges, insistence upon the radical disconnect between experience and rational/conceptual engagement within the space of reasons that fostered much of the pragmatist's problem with objectivity.

How might one justify such an enriched notion of experience? In light of Sellars/Rorty qualms about the given, one surely cannot argue that such a notion better approximates the phenomenological realities: that is because the phenomenological realities are constituted by the theoretical framework in terms of which experiences are reported and described. Levine cannot coherently claim to offer a theory of experience that comes closer to capturing the directly accessible phenomenological facts. But he need make no such claim. Like Rorty before him, he need only claim that his preferred, richer notion of experience better serves purposes of prediction, control and explanation of the human condition.

The overarching pragmatist goal is not revision of discursive and/or conceptual practice; it is, in Sellars' words, demonstration of "how things in the broadest possible sense of the term hang together in the broadest possible sense of the term."[5] Levine sees this clearly. The reader of his excellent book is provided with motivation and resources for determining whether the recommended experience-theoretic strategy moves us closer to legitimizing the notion of objectivity that we seek to preserve. Moreover, Levine's strategy is counter-revolutionary: for Rorty tells us that pragmatism

is the doctrine that there are no constraints on inquiry save conversational ones -- no wholesale constraints derived from the nature of the objects, or of the mind, or of language, but only those retail constraints provided by the remarks of our fellow inquirers.[6]

If Levine's strategy is successful, then this tenet of neo-pragmatism must be rejected. Readers already sympathetic to the primacy of social practice over ontology are thus led to ask whether putting some rich notion of experience to work is in any way preferable to having the work done by rich conversational norms -- and, ultimately, what difference this might make.[7]

[1] Richard Rorty, Consequences of Pragmatism (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 1982): xiii.

[2] Wilfrid Sellars, Empiricism and the Philosophy of Mind (Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 1997).

[3] Richard Rorty, "Mind-Body Identity, Privacy, and Categories," reprinted in D. Rosenthal (ed.), Materialism and the Mind-Body Problem (Englewood Cliffs: Prentice Hall, 1971): 174-99.

[4] Richard Rorty, "In Defense of Eliminative Materialism," reprinted in Rosenthal op. cit.: 229.

[5] Wilfrid Sellars, "Philosophy and the Scientific Image of Man," in Frontiers of Science and Philosophy, edited by Robert Colodny (Pittsburgh: University of Pittsburgh Press, 1962): 35.

[6] Rorty, op. cit.:165.

[7] It might be a trade-off, depending upon what one is doing in specifying an ontology. See my "Universals, Metaphysical Explanations, and Pragmatism," Journal of Philosophy 107 (2010): 590-609.