Pragmatism's Advantage: American and European Philosophy at the End of the Twentieth Century

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Joseph Margolis, Pragmatism's Advantage: American and European Philosophy at the End of the Twentieth Century, Stanford UP, 2010, 172pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804770460.

Reviewed by Drew Christie, University of New Hampshire



In more than thirty books over forty years Joseph Margolis has crafted an admirable body of thought, key themes of which include Heraclitian flux, constructivism without idealism, the metaphysical importance of the natural/cultural divide, the inadequacy of putative attempts at foundational and transcendental arguments, a sophisticated relativism, and the importance of legitimation (as opposed to foundational justification). He is always careful to position himself in relation to the brightest historical and contemporary stars. Margolis is at his best when he develops a single theme in detail: e.g., Science without unity: reconciling the human and natural sciences (1987). He provides an overview in Historied thought, constructed world (1995). Margolis’s oeuvre deserves more attention. Unfortunately, his latest book is too general and too partisan to convince. By contrast, Robert Brandom offers a comparatively detailed and constructive approach to many important concerns they share.

The volume under review, a spirited, polemical comparative evaluation of analytic, continental and pragmatist philosophies, finds pragmatism the most promising of the three. Margolis believes that pragmatism earns the advantage because it presents “a Darwinized Hegel,” a recognition of the metaphysical divide between cultural and natural entities, and an appreciation of the constructed, encultured, and artifactual nature of the self. Margolis sees analytic philosophy as encumbered with materialism, scientism, reductionism, and extensionality. With regard to continental philosophy, he complains of unwarranted transcendentalism and a tendency toward abstruse, gnomic declarations.

Margolis like Richard Rorty believes that there something is fundamentally wrong with both analytic and continental philosophy. Margolis maintains “The whole of Western philosophy was, I think, becalmed, traumatically affected by the Second World War and the cold war, and by and large, almost nothing got through the conceptual haze that was not a recycling of the seemingly successful inquiries of the first half of the century” (x). However, where Margolis and Rorty see a muddle, many other philosophers see vibrant, diverse traditions. This more positive framing of the situation sees analytic, continental and pragmatist philosophies as vigorous ongoing traditions. By analogy, one can appreciate the best within the classical, jazz and rock music traditions without having to choose among them. Each tradition has things to learn from the other and there are wonderful fusion works. However, there is no call for a grand musical synthesis, a single best style of music making. My point is that one need not follow Margolis in either his dismal assessment of contemporary philosophy or his demand that we pick a winner among the various schools.

I believe that each tradition is so diverse that meaningful comparisons among the three are impossible. For example, Marx, Nietzsche, Bergson, Husserl, Bordieu, Beauvoir, Fanon, Foucault, Adorno, Irigaray, Latour, Heidegger, Derrida, Žižek and Levinas are so different as to reveal no significant underlying unity. Similar diversity reigns among Russell, Carnap, Strawson, Austin, Quine, Jaggar, Rawls, Bulter, Kripke, West and Sellars. Many figures like Arendt and the later Wittgenstein are in no clear camp. Concerning the pragmatists, Margolis writes that they are “genuinely interesting figures; but as a single movement Pragmatism is a disappointing hodgepodge that must be redirected” (13). The criticisms below develop my concern about the impossibility of generalizing about hodgepodges and untidy groupings.

Margolis maintains that analytic philosophy is scientistic and reductionist. Among his targets are the materialist, empiricist, biologist, behaviorist, and extensionalist projects that have played a central role in analytic philosophy. Margolis is correct in emphasizing that reductionist projects have been a key part of analytic philosophy from its inception. Using Brandom’s terminology, the typical project has been the reduction (definition, translation) of a target vocabulary into a base vocabulary. Bertrand Russell attempted to show that everything that can be said using the language of definite descriptions could also be said in the language of first order quantificational theory. His much more ambitious logicist program aimed to reduce mathematics to logic. Empiricist analytics attempted to reduce (define, translate) everything into sensory experiences. The Positivists’ verification principle is a species of reductionism.

However, these key strands are by no means the whole of analytic philosophy. From the beginning, G.E. Moore warned against the "naturalistic fallacy." J. L. Austin eschewed every form of reductionism. More recently, Kripke’s essentialism runs counter to reductive naturalism. Many analytics are “naturalists” only in the broad sense that they reject supernatural entities and causation. Reductionist claims are often met by analytics with great skepticism. Analytic philosophy is populated by talk of rigid designators, possible worlds, split brains, twin earths, Chinese boxes, brains in vats and justified true beliefs without knowledge. This imaginative assortment, useful in conceptual analysis, is far removed from scientistic, reductionist projects.

Furthermore, Margolis’s use of the term “reduction” is too broad. Many philosophers find it useful to emphasize that reduction is a binary relation between Xs and Ys that comes in ontological, explanatory and methodological varieties. Too often Margolis’s animadversions apply to some versions of “reduction” and not others. For example, lots of philosophers of biology think that molecular biology reduces ontologically to physics, but not explanatorily or methodologically.

Not only does Margolis ignore the many non-naturalist analytic philosophers, but he neglects to discuss the significance to analytic philosophy of logic and of the linguistic turn. He makes approving nods toward admirable analytic rigor, but does not associate that rigor with logic. Margolis’s failure to discuss logic and the associated formal tools will strike most analytics as bizarre. How can one compare philosophies without considering both their strengths and weaknesses? Not only is logic a great strength of analytic philosophy, but it is a great weakness of the pragmatists (Pierce excepted). Logic is central to a fair evaluation of analytic philosophy because philosophy has always stressed the clarification, explication and critique of concepts as in Socrates’ discussion of piety in the Euthyphro. Logic greatly expands the tools available to philosophers. One need not claim formalization is the only form of clarification and explication to appreciate that it provides powerful tools for the explication of concepts.

Margolis might hold that the demise of the analytic/synthetic distinction undermines conceptual analysis. Richard Rorty held such a view. Rorty and Margolis both fault analytics for believing that they are capable of clear and distinct views of Platonic forms and Aristotelian essences. However, analytics might well see their “truths” as the most justified beliefs of the era. A carefully argued analysis (e.g., of the term property) is a significant contribution to scholarship even if it has a shelf-life of less than 100 years. Margolis and Rorty are wrong to accuse analytics of foundationist and eternalist pretensions.

Another aspect of Margolis’s critique of analytics, shared with many continentals, is that analytics ignore the biological/cultural divide. He believes that humans and culture evolve within and are constrained by biology, but are sui generis, “and cannot be explained in biological terms alone” (55). I cannot share Margolis’s excitement about the biological/cultural divide, the distinction between what is studied by the Naturwissenschaften and by the Geisteswissenschaften. Margolis is surely right that among analytic philosophers, philosophies of physics and of biology attract far more attention and prestige than philosophies of the social sciences or of the humanities. But it would be a mistake to interpret this sociological observation with an affirmation by analytics that cultural phenomena are explicable in materialist terms. Rather, agnosticism concerning explanatory reductions of the cultural to the biological (genetics or neuroscience) is more prevalent than conviction. No one takes seriously the possibility that biologists will put language-oriented disciplines out of business.

Where continentals go wrong according to Margolis is in trying to hold on to the Kantian ideal of philosophy as the queen of the sciences. They practice an “overinflated extranaturalism” (36). Apfel’s and Habermas’s transcendental arguments are heavily critiqued for transcendental pretentions which are presented as of a piece with Kant’s giving transcendental proofs of Euclidean geometry (91). Many pages are devoted to challenging Husserl’s claims to apodictic certainty. Margolis writes that after the Kehr Heidegger is “stubbornly committed to the revelatory powers of Sein, or Being, possibly of an even deeper power” (10). Just as analytics will be upset to find themselves labeled “scientistic,” continentals will be equally disturbed to find themselves branded “anti-naturalist.” While some analytics will find the charge applicable to Husserl and Heidegger, the accusation makes no sense concerning such figures as Beauvoir, Foucault or Adorno.

For someone claiming to be a pragmatist, Margolis is highly critical of both classical and contemporary pragmatists. He finds that Pierce “veers off more and more insistently from what he originally took to be pragmatism’s theme” and that Pierce’s “clarifications are too ambiguous to be fully trusted” (13, 115), that James is a “pop figure” who presented a theory of truth “utterly without skill” (13, 37), and that "Dewey is often “banal” and suffers from “insuperable indeterminacies” (13, 25). Nor does Margolis identify with the so-called neo-pragmatists, Richard Rorty and Hilary Putnam.

Who and what does Margolis endorse? Among historical figures Margolis’s favorite is Hegel, if Darwinized and shorn of Geist which is “a blunderbuss that hides even more than it explains” (51). Thomas Kuhn’s Structure of Scientific Revolutions is praised because it “makes objectivity a historicized construction, denies every dream of neutral knowledge, retires the God’s-Eye view of science … and disdains canonical philosophies of science altogether” (133). Margolis is also impressed with the Darwinized Hegelianism that he finds in Dewey’s Experience and Nature. Margolis agrees with C.I. Lewis’s belief that “neither human experiences nor the human mind has a character which is universal, fixed and absolute … Our categories and definitions are peculiarly social products” (125). Ernst Cassirer, An Essay on Man (1953), is lauded for his account of “symbolic forms” that “provides more than a sketch of how a Hegelianized version of Kant might actually work” (71). What virtues do Margolis’s five heroes exhibit? Each appeals to eras of thought separated by thousands of years and to the associated evolution of our basic categories. Additionally, each avoids the reduction of the linguistic and cultural to nature. However, I do not see Hegel, Cassirer, Dewey, C.I. Lewis and Kuhn pointing toward the unified program of revitalized pragmatism for which Margolis hopes.

Robert Brandom, as distinguished as any contemporary philosopher, comes to quite different conclusions after wrestling with many of the same issues as Margolis. As a dissertation advisee of Richard Rorty’s, Brandom is thoroughly familiar with skeptical appraisals of philosophy. Both Brandom and Margolis see themselves as pragmatists, though with considerable qualms about the classical pragmatists. Brandom, like Margolis, is a great admirer of Hegel and recognizes a sharp distinction between things having natures and things having histories. He agrees with Margolis that reductionisms in the form of naturalism, empiricism and functionalism are major, often flawed, strands in analytic philosophy. Brandom further agrees that pragmatism (broadly construed to include Wittgenstein) poses the most significant challenge to the classical projects of analytic philosophy. However, on three important points of disagreement I prefer Brandom. First, he admires and has made major contributions to logic and the explication of concepts. Second, he is within the transcendentalist tradition when he investigates the preconditions of meaningful discourse (what one must be able to do if one is to say anything). Third, Brandom’s integration of pragmatist insights is less programmatic and more detailed than that of Margolis.

Margolis’s energetic comparative evaluation of analytic, continental and pragmatist philosophies relies too often on the overgeneralizations that analytic and continental philosophers toss at each other. Analytic philosophy is much more than scientistic naturalism. Logic, as a tool in the explication of concepts, is too significant to overlook in an assessment of analytic philosophy. Continental philosophy is much more than overblown transcendental arguments and erudite claims to privileged vision. The biology/culture divide, though philosophically puzzling, is widely recognized. Margolis’s revitalized pragmatism is more dream than reality. It is too early to declare a winner among the analytic, continental and pragmatic approaches.


Brandom, R. (2008). Between saying and doing: towards an analytic pragmatism. Oxford ; New York, Oxford University Press.

Brandom, R. (2009). Reason in philosophy: animating ideas. Cambridge, Mass., Belknap Press of Harvard University Press.

Cassirer, E. (1953). An essay on man: an introduction to a philosophy of human culture. Garden City, N.Y., Doubleday.

Dewey, J. (1925). Experience and nature. Chicago, London,, Open Court Publishing Company.

Kuhn, T. S. (1962). The structure of scientific revolutions. Chicago, University of Chicago Press.

Lewis, C. I. (1929). Mind and the world-order; outline of a theory of knowledge. New York, C. Scribner’s Sons.

Margolis, J. (1995). Historied thought, constructed world: conceptual primer for the turn of the millennium. Berkeley, University of California Press.