Pragmatism’s Evolution: Organism and Environment in American Philosophy

Pragmatisms Evolution

Trevor Pearce, Pragmatism’s Evolution: Organism and Environment in American Philosophy, The University of Chicago Press, 2020, 365pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780226719917.

Reviewed by Daniel Herbert, University of Sheffield


While it is widely acknowledged that pragmatist philosophy originated within an intellectual climate profoundly shaped by evolutionary theory and its initial reception in the United States, the details of this cultural environment and of its influence upon the early pragmatists have tended to receive less attention than they merit. Trevor Pearce’s impressive and well-researched study addresses this gap in the literature on early pragmatism, but it is also intended to appeal to historians and philosophers of biology, given its focus upon the various debates to which evolutionary theory gave rise in late Nineteenth and early twentieth century America, not only between supporters and rivals of evolution, but also amongst champions of different schools of evolutionism. Pearce understands the pragmatist tradition in a broad sense, in terms of relations within and between ‘cohorts’ of scholars, not all of whom are customarily acknowledged as ‘pragmatists’ in standard histories of the movement, notwithstanding their overlapping historical experiences, academic environments and cultural climates. Focussing throughout upon their cultural context and the details of their interventions in an on-going debate which he traces from the 1860s to the first decade of the twentieth century, Pearce is primarily concerned to situate the pragmatists within their lively intellectual environment, rather than to reconstruct and elucidate their doctrines and arguments in less explicitly historical terms. As such, Pearce does not seek to specify any particular doctrinal content to which one must subscribe in order to qualify as an authentic pragmatist.

Chapter One addresses the initial reception of Darwin’s theory in the United States, focussing upon the members of the Metaphysical Club and their various reactions to evolutionary theory. Pearce examines Louis Agassiz’s influence among ambitious young scientists of the period and his hostility to Darwinian ideas, with particular regard to his significance in the intellectual biographies of Peirce and James—the co-founders of the pragmatist tradition. Their eventual enthusiasm for evolutionary science notwithstanding, Pearce suggests that it was their personal connections with Agassiz—a close friend of Peirce’s father—which accounts for the initially lukewarm response which Peirce and James gave to Darwin’s theory.

The scholarship throughout this chapter—as indeed throughout the entire work—is highly impressive, and is itself sufficient basis upon which to recommend Pearce’s text to those interested in the origins of philosophical pragmatism. Particularly noteworthy is the attention which Chauncey Wright, Francis Ellingwood Abbot, and John Fiske, all early converts to Darwinism, receive in Pearce’s treatment of the period. According to Pearce, it was principally as philosophers rather than as scientists that members of the Metaphysical Club participated in debates surrounding evolution, and he suggests that it was a common commitment to a broad form of positivism which accounts for the relative lack of hesitation with which Abbot, Fiske, and Wright came to accept Darwin’s theory. Despite his philosophical focus, however, Pearce does not neglect to address the observational findings which fuelled debate between critics and supporters of evolution, providing an accessible account of this biological subject-matter.

In Chapter Two, Pearce’s attention turns to Herbert Spencer’s evolutionary philosophy and its reception amongst the first cohort of pragmatists. Though he was to many of his contemporaries the equal of Kant or Aristotle, Spencer is rarely discussed in recent histories of philosophy other than to note the monumental extent of his influence during his lifetime and the neglect into which his work has since fallen. In Pearce’s text, however, Spencer’s influence upon the early pragmatists is examined in detail—through their reviews, lecture courses, and correspondence. With the exception of Fiske, an enthusiastic Spencerian, the first cohort of pragmatists are shown to have been ambivalent towards Spencer’s philosophy: appreciating its broad outlines while criticising its details. Wright, for instance, took exception to the teleological orientation of Spencer’s progressive account of evolution as directed towards the ‘improvement’ of species. For James, whose critique of Spencer occupies much of the chapter, it was Spencer’s mechanistic understanding of the evolutionary process, and his alleged neglect of human spontaneity which required correction. Spencer’s understandings of the concepts of life and environment are shown to have been of profound importance to James, who nonetheless objects that Spencer made the human agent purely passive or reactive in relation to changes in its surroundings, without appreciating that mankind is no less often the creative source of environmental change. Pearce concludes, however, that James’s uncharitable criticisms miss their target and that Spencer might more accurately be understood as presenting humankind as both actively and passively related to its environment.

Pearce’s third chapter offers an impressively thorough survey of the various sources which informed the second cohort of pragmatists during their university studies of evolutionary thought in Germany and the United States. Having won general acceptance within the scientific community by the 1870s, evolution was no longer a matter of such controversy amongst pragmatism’s second generation as it had been amongst its first, and Pearce leaves his audience in no doubt as to the pervasive influence of evolutionism throughout the academic culture within which Royce, Dewey, Addams, Mead and Du Bois were educated. As Pearce shows through a detailed study of their respective course syllabi, teachers, and reading materials, the major figures of pragmatism’s second cohort were keen students of evolutionary biology during college and graduate school, and retained the same enthusiasm for evolution in their educational careers. Pearce argues that Royce, Du Bois, and their second cohort pragmatist contemporaries were not only well-informed about the evolutionary thinking of their time but that its significance for these philosophers extended well beyond the disciplinary confines of biological science, conditioning their entire philosophical outlook. Here, as throughout this text, Spencer’s importance to the intellectual culture of the period is never far from the surface, and Pearce explains how Spencerianism featured in the university education of the second cohort of pragmatists, with particular attention to James’s criticisms of Spencer, and their relevance for Royce and Dewey. As such, Pearce credits Spencer with a remarkable—although quite different—significance for the first two generations of pragmatists.

Chapter Four takes its title from Peirce’s suggestive remark that “Hegelianism needs to be Darwinized”, and explores the relationship between evolutionism and Anglophone idealism during the late Nineteenth Century. Dewey’s often remarked upon indebtedness to the British idealist tradition is addressed in detail and Pearce examines the responses of Green, Caird, and other Oxford idealists to the evolutionary science of the period. Whereas Green is shown to have accepted evolutionary biology while rejecting the philosophical commitments of Spencerian ‘evolutionism’, other British idealists drew inspiration from Darwin’s theory of evolution in formulating their own systems of philosophy. As such, Pearce shows that the pragmatists were not alone in putting evolutionary ideas to broader philosophical use while criticising Spencer’s specific brand of evolutionist philosophy. Pearce’s stated aim with this chapter is to challenge the assumption that evolutionary science is somehow in tension with Schellingian-Hegelian idealism, and cannot, therefore, have influenced the pragmatists—and those of the second cohort in particular—without having compromised their commitment to Hegelianism. Like Bernstein, Stern, and several others, Pearce recognises many significant affinities between Hegel and the pragmatists, but his text devotes particular attention to the opportunities which second generation pragmatist philosophers identified for interpreting dialectical logic and evolutionary theory in terms of one another. Hegel’s influence upon Royce and Du Bois, and their respective efforts to re-imagine a dialectical philosophy within an evolutionary perspective, is a topic of particular interest in this chapter, and Pearce offers an especially fascinating account of Du Bois’s affinities with Hegelianism.

Having until this point offered a reasonably unified account of evolutionary theory from 1860 to 1910, Pearce begins in Chapter Five to address some of the disagreements between rival schools of scientific evolutionism during the period. August Weismann’s neo-Darwinism is set against the neo-Lamarckism of Herbert Spencer, and different pragmatists are discussed against the background of the ‘factors of evolution’ debate which occupied late-Nineteenth Century biologists. Pearce clearly and helpfully sets out the issues at stake in terms of a disagreement over whether acquired traits are inherited—the position of Spencer and the neo-Lamarckians—or whether, as Weismann and his neo-Darwinian supporters maintained—a progeny’s biological inheritance is exclusively conditioned by its parents genetically inborn ‘germ-plasm’. Pearce offers a detailed account of some of the principal exchanges of this debate in which leading pragmatists came to be involved, devoting particular attention to James, Peirce, and their respective criticisms of Spencer. Peirce’s evolutionary metaphysics is discussed in terms of his anti-Spencerian neo-Lamarckism, which rejects Spencer’s mechanically deterministic understanding of the evolutionary process while allowing traits acquired through habit to be transferred or inherited. As Pearce shows, however, the ‘factors’ debate not only was of theoretical interest during this period, but also attracted the attention of commentators apparently concerned with humankind’s prospects for intergenerational biological ‘improvement’. This chapter includes, moreover, a highly noteworthy discussion of the exchange between Addams and Dewey regarding the necessity (or lack thereof) of social conflict for human progress, in the course of which Peter Kropotkin’s evolutionary thought is also examined.

In the penultimate chapter of his commendable study, Pearce focusses upon the second cohort of pragmatists in respect of their ethical and political concerns, and the experimentalist approach which they took in addressing social problems. As Pearce explains, many pragmatists thought of evolution as analogous to a progressive experimental process, wherein organisms (or hypotheses) compete, and the less well-adapted are gradually eliminated by the pressures of their environment. After a brief discussion of James’s consequentialist ethics of desire-satisfaction—a major influence upon the following generation of pragmatists—Pearce outlines the scientific ethos which informed second cohort pragmatist interventions in social problems concerning education, racial prejudice, industrial relations and the exploitation of labour. Mead, Dewey, Addams, and Du Bois are shown to have regarded on-going empirical research in the social sciences as indispensably necessary to effectively tackling social problems so as to maximise desire-satisfaction. Dewey is presented as paradigmatic of a pragmatist approach to ethics, which draws upon evolutionary models by treating ethical inquiry as responsive to the pressures of a problematic environment which organisms must either adapt to or else transform by intelligent interventions in situations about which it is possible to become better informed by empirical study. Addams’s important activities and research at Hull House are discussed as exemplary cases of reform-minded pragmatist social activism, as well as Du Bois’s sociological and economic studies in connection with late-Nineteenth Century US race-relations. The chapter concludes with a disquieting account of various pragmatists’ early and mercifully temporary interests in eugenic pseudo-science.

Pearce’s final chapter examines the influence of evolutionary ideas upon early pragmatist logical theory, arguing for greater continuity between Peirce, James, and Dewey in this matter than is customarily supposed. Peirce-enthusiasts are not unlikely to suspect Pearce of understating Peirce’s differences from Dewey on this topic, and may bristle at his suggestion that both were committed to a ‘natural history’ approach to logical theory. Pearce parts company with such commentators as Christopher Hookway and Cheryl Misak in attributing Peirce’s disapproval at Dewey’s logical theory to his own disagreeable temperament, and maintains that in spite of his protestations to the contrary, Peirce’s logic of inquiry contains elements of a natural history approach—particularly in its evolutionarily-informed theories of belief, doubt, and abductive inference. As such, this is perhaps Pearce’s most controversial chapter, although his account of the naturalistic features of Peirce’s theory of inquiry underlines important and much-overlooked affinities with other members of the pragmatist tradition. Less contentious are Pearce’s discussions of the experimentalist outlook common amongst the early pragmatists, which highlight Peirce’s commitment to an observational and experimental feature of deductive reasoning. Throughout this chapter, Pearce stressed the evolutionary analogy in Peirce’s theory of inquiry, and its profound importance for subsequent pragmatist epistemologies deeply indebted to a biological image of the inquirer as an environmentally-situated natural organism struggling to replace maladaptive patterns of behaviour with alternatives more fitting to their situation. Here, indeed, one can hardly escape Pearce’s overarching claim that the pragmatists were enormously informed by and indebted to evolutionary theory.

There is much to recommend Pearce’s comprehensive and engaging study, which shall provide a valuable resource to all scholars and researchers working on late-nineteenth and early-twentieth century American philosophy. That the early pragmatists were profoundly influenced by debates in evolutionary science can hardly have escaped the notice of anyone with even a passing acquaintance with their work, but Pearce’s text lifts this familiar observation above a casual platitude and uncovers the complexity of the relevant contemporary discussions, communicating something of the urgency and vitality of a period of remarkable intellectual ferment. The attention which Pearce gives to the British idealists and to Spencer, in particular, is an especially welcome feature of his excellent monograph, which thereby locates the early pragmatists in the context of a nineteenth century philosophical culture, many of whose leading British representatives have since largely disappeared from popular consciousness. Pearce’s cohort-based approach also carries the further merit of not prejudging whose contributions to the pragmatist tradition are most worthy of attention, or, indeed, which are the doctrines most characteristic of philosophical pragmatism. His discussions of such first cohort pragmatists as Wright and Fiske do much to shed light on the intellectual climate within which Peirce and James originated, and Pearce affords to Mead, Addams, and Du Bois a courtesy which they have been too often denied—that of being treated as original and significant philosophers in their own right, rather than merely contemporaries of Dewey. Amongst its many other virtues, then, Pearce’s text represents a welcome contribution to efforts at extending the pragmatist canon beyond the familiar trio of Peirce, James, and Dewey—which is not to deny that these figures receive the attention they merit in any history of pragmatism. As such, Pearce’s text deserves to be very warmly received amongst scholars of pragmatist philosophy.