Pragmatist Egalitarianism

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David Rondel, Pragmatist Egalitarianism, Oxford University Press, 2018, 221pp. $85.00, ISBN 9780190680688.

Reviewed by Kasper Lippert-Rasmussen, University of Århus


David Rondel assumes that equality is “a worthy moral and political ideal” (p. 18). His main aim is to show how it should be understood. Rondel’s point of departure is the disagreement “between those who regard equality as a fundamentally distributive ideal and those who regard it as a ‘moral ideal governing the relations in which people stand to one another’” (p. 1; cp. p. 170).1

This disagreement has had a prominent place in political philosophy since Elizabeth Anderson’s 1999 article, “What Is the Point of Equality?”2 While relational egalitarians have offered various positive accounts of justice, they are united in their belief that, at a fundamental level, justice is not concerned with, or at least not only concerned with, the distribution of goods, e.g., resources, welfare, or capabilities. Friends of a distributive ideal of equality, on their side, have tended to dismiss the relational critique as not addressing the value of equality at a sufficiently basic level, or to argue that many, if not most, relational egalitarian concerns can be captured in distributive terms.3

Rondel pursues a reconciliatory project. He wants to resolve the “interegalitarian disputes” (p. 2) between relational and distributive egalitarians and to defend the claim that “egalitarians should be ‘pluralists’” (pp. xi, 169). Moreover, Rondel thinks pragmatism is “uniquely equipped” to articulate such reconciliation (p. 2).

Pragmatism is a broad current of philosophy and is normally contrasted with currents such as rationalism, ordinary language philosophy, logical positivism etc. Since its focus is on the nature of philosophy and core philosophical questions — e.g., what is the nature of truth? — and since “pragmatist engagement” with moral and political philosophy “has been fractional and occasional” (p. 12), it would be surprising if one could directly resolve the disagreement between distributive and relational egalitarianism by deriving a set of principles of justice from pragmatism. Hence, Rondel wisely disavows any ambition to show how pragmatist principles justify “a particular set of political institutions or commitments” (p. 18). In effect, he also (and, in my view, equally wisely) has no ambition to show that his favored pluralist egalitarian view could not be justified on non-pragmatist grounds (more on this later).

Rondel’s book is a welcome addition to the present body of literature. His reconciliatory project deserves attention given that political philosophers have mostly thought of relational egalitarianism as an alternative to distributive egalitarianism, despite the fact that logically speaking, nothing stands in the way of a pluralist form of egalitarianism that draws on distributive as well as relational egalitarianism.

The book has two parts. Part I directly engages with the disagreement between distributive and relational egalitarians through the lens of a wider distinction between vertical and horizontal egalitarianism. The former

evokes the image of a wise and fair judge, distributing to each individual the share of rights and resources to which they are justly entitled [and, thus, encompasses distributive ideals of equality]. Horizontal egalitarianism evokes the image of a model town hall meeting . . . a place where individuals stand to one another in relations of mutual respect and equality (p. 30)

The latter is the heading under which relational egalitarianism falls.

Rondel claims that much liberal thinking about equality takes a vertical form. It is basically about how a just state treats its citizens. This statocentric approach to equality comes out in Dworkin’s attempt to ground his version of distributive equality in the requirement that the state treats citizens with equal concern and respect (pp. 44-45). On this approach, egalitarian justice does not pertain to the beliefs and behavior of private individuals and to social meaning and culture. The horizontal model is different, and to show this Rondel appeals to the “egalitarian vision of Marx and Engels” (p. 47). According to this vision, a “society can be perfectly egalitarian from a vertical or juridical point of view . . . and still be awful from a horizontal . . . point of view” (pp. 53-54), e.g., because workers are alienated and subjected to the relational power of their employers.

Unfortunately, political philosophers have tended to see the two forms of equality as competing ideals in the sense that they have tended to assume that “the whole truth about equality must be conveyed by a single idea or an exclusive set of principles” (p. 62). Friends of the vertical approach, e.g., Rawls and Dworkin, have tended to assume that, given the right set of institutions, problems of vertical inequality will disappear (pp. 64-66). Similarly, friends of horizontal equality, e.g., Iris Marion Young, have tended to assume that what is really needed to address unjust inequalities is a reform of beliefs and culture. Indeed, some friends of the horizontal view have been “eliminativists” about vertical justice in the sense that they think distributive justice is a remedial virtue, the need for which will be transcended in a future communist, classless society. Such assumptions reflect a “much broader philosophical longing for comprehensiveness and fundamentality” (p. 63) of which pragmatists are critical and, according to Rondel, the pertinent reductionist and eliminativist views are “problematically one-sided and incomplete” (p. 69). Rondel’s ambition is to combine “the elements of truth that each” of these two views of equality offer “without succumbing to their limitations and biases” (p. 70). This is the task undertaken in Part II.

Part II contains an exposition of Rondel’s favored pluralist egalitarianism, drawing on the resources offered by pragmatism in general and Dewey, James, and Rorty in particular. Rondel notes that his reconciliation of vertical and horizontal egalitarianism is achieved through something close to “the Rortyan idea of reconciliation by redescription” (p. 88). Rather than describing equality and the problems it poses in terms of the putatively unhelpful distinction between vertical and horizontal equality and by implication, the distinction between relational and distributive equality, Rondel proposes to describe them in terms of the three “variables”: institutions, personal beliefs and behavior, and culture. He submits that “where inequality is a problem, it is virtually always a problem for all three” variables (p. 77).

Dewey provides the main inspiration for Rondel’s treatment of institutions. As Rondel notes, this source of inspiration might be surprising, since on Dewey’s view democracy is not a set of institutions, but a “way of life” (p. 89). However, Dewey’s view of democracy is laudable for its experimentalist approach. On that view, institutions are not to be assessed on the basis of their “conformity or lack of conformity with abstract principles of individual liberty . . . , but instead by their ability (or inability) to reliably bring about certain concrete consequences for individuals and groups” (p. 90). Which “concrete consequences” one might ask? But Rondel thinks (Dewey’s) pragmatism enables us to see why this question is infelicitous. Social ideals should be approached in an experimentalist way and cannot be pronounced from the armchair. Rondel notes an interesting parallel to Elizabeth Anderson’s views, whom he quotes, submitting that ideals “function as hypotheses to be tested in experience”, i.e., “by putting them into practice and seeing whether they solve the problems for which they were devised” (p. 110).4 In the course of doing so, we might even revise what we see as the problems under consideration. To the extent that relational egalitarians are influenced by pragmatism, Rondel uncovers a deeper background to why relational and distributive egalitarians differ in relation to the role of the concerns of real-world egalitarians in philosophical theorizing about the ideal of equality (p. 80).

Rondel’s individualist egalitarianism builds on William James and his exploration of individual belief and behavior. Rondel shows how James’ form of individualism involves certain deep egalitarian commitments: “we are all fundamentally equal as individuals, in being possessors of a unique inward view, and we are to be treated as equals — by other people and by political institutions — in light of this fact” (p. 123). Part of what that involves — but plausibly far from all — is a “willingness to listen to others” (p. 135). However, Rondel thinks that it is not possible to offer necessary and jointly sufficient conditions for treating others as equals (p. 124).

Rondel’s discussion of the third variable draws on Rorty’s views on morality and culture. Those views are based on Rorty’s anti-realism, according to which morality is basically a matter of “we-intentions” (p. 149) and according to which fundamental moral disagreements are rationally irresolvable. This does not mean however, that all cultures are equally good, according to Rorty. More specifically, he thinks that the kind of redescriptions that for some would qualify as instances of political correctness, have resulted in a more civilized, less hierarchical and domination-prone contemporary US society and culture than in the sixties (pp. 162-165). This linguistic aspect of an account of an egalitarian society is presently undertheorized and Rondel deserves credit for emphasizing it.

In closing, Rondel summarizes his reconciliation of distributive and relational egalitarianism. He stresses that his reconciliation is put forward in a pragmatist spirit, i.e., as something that is “impermanent, open to revision and experimentally tentative” (p. 74). It is incomplete, makes no claim to “determinacy, conclusiveness, and normative precision” (p. 74), or to articulate the essence of equality (p. 82). It is pluralist in that it acknowledges that there are “myriad ways in which a concern for equality can rear its head” (p. 74). It is to be accepted or rejected depending on whether it is useful for “dealing with the problems” of inequality (p. 83). These problems are, as Rondel emphasizes — much in the spirit of relational egalitarians — the real-world problems that occupy real-world egalitarians (see above). Interestingly, however, Rondel thinks, unlike relational egalitarians, that among such problems are problems of distributive equality per se (pp. 175-178, 201-202).

As already indicated, there are several things to praise in Rondel’s book. However, in the remaining part of this review I will mention two aspects which I found less persuasive. First, while Rondel’s tour de force through the ethics and political philosophy of three important pragmatist thinkers is learned, and thought-provoking, I was less certain about how strongly it is connected to his proposed reconciliation between distributive and relational egalitarianism. Take for instance the core claim of relational egalitarians, e.g., that to the extent that we relate to one another as equals, no distributive pattern will render our society unjust. As far as I can see, all of the three pragmatists seem sympathetic to this core claim by relational egalitarians.5

Take another core question in the debate between relational and distributive egalitarianism: Can purely natural inequalities be unjust? Relational egalitarians think not, whereas at least some luck egalitarian theorists think they can. Again, Rondel does not directly address this question in Part II and again, as far as I can tell, nothing suggests that the three pragmatists side with distributive egalitarians here, and indeed there are some indications that they side with relational egalitarians (e.g., the pragmatist focus on real-world problems).

Perhaps Rondel’s three pragmatists think, or are committed to thinking, that the questions regarding the injustice of inequalities that do not undermine egalitarian social relations and the injustice of natural inequalities are not important. Williams James, for example, might think that it is much more important to address questions about how we charitably put ourselves in the shoes of others. However, deeming an issue between two opposing views as being less important than other issues is different from reconciling the two opposing views, i.e., it remains the case that one must choose between the two views despite the fact that the choice itself is less important. In relation to the two core claims mentioned, it seems likely that the three pragmatists will simply side with relational egalitarians.

My other critical remark concerns Rondel’s main claim that “a tenable egalitarianism will be pluralistic” (p. 169). By this he means two things. It is normatively pluralistic, e.g., that not only are unequal distributions unjust, but so too are hierarchical social relations, and the concern for either cannot be reduced to a concern for the other (p. 171). To defend this claim, Rondel appeals to a thought experiment in which significant inequality exists, but it somehow does not lead to oppression or deficiencies of participation or any other kind of hierarchical social relations to which relational egalitarians object (p. 171). He thinks, and I agree, that such a situation involves injustice. Interestingly, in line with my first critical point, this straightforward objection to a monist, social relational ideal is independent of any appeal to the views of his three main pragmatist thinkers, or indeed pragmatism in general.

Rondel’s second sense of “pluralism” encapsulates that his three variables are all causally effective in bringing about unjust inequality (pp. 169, 191). I find both normative and causal pluralism plausible. However, neither distributive, nor relational, egalitarians need to take any stance on the second form of pluralism (unlike the first). They are not putting forward any causal theses qua distributive or relational egalitarians. Hence, in proposing causal pluralism, Rondel is not somehow transcending the disagreement between distributive and relational egalitarians.6

Moreover, while by temperament pragmatists might be favorably inclined towards normative pluralism, there is nothing in pragmatism that rules out monism with regard to the (dis)value of certain items. Take money, for example. Money has value only instrumentally — if we set aside the way in which money is a means to pursue and achieve other ends that are non-instrumentally valuable, there is nothing good about money. Surely, pragmatists can agree with this plausible point; and they can do so without any commitment to “essences”, “fundamentality”, or a priori grasp of necessities in the senses of which they are otherwise skeptical (cf. p. 173). One could think that our concern for money should be explored experimentally and empirically and concede that things could have been different, e.g., that we could have been such that our concern for money was (partly) non-instrumental.

We cannot assume in advance that there is one concern for equality which is fundamental in the sense that all other concerns for equality can somehow be reduced to that concern (p. 201). But, similarly, we cannot assume either that all concerns for equality — which as Rondel’s book reminds us, are quite diverse — are irreducible.

All in all, Rondel’s book offers some interesting new insights on the nature of the ideal of equality. His reconciliatory aim regarding distributive and relational views is laudable, and he offers some good arguments in its favor. While pragmatism can elucidate certain aspects of the distributive-relational egalitarian debate, ultimately, I am skeptical of any more ambitious claims on behalf of pragmatism in this respect. This, however, is not to say that Rondel’s exploration of the implications of pragmatism for the issue of justice is not interesting in itself or insightful — it is. In any case, his book is helpful reading for philosophers interested in the recent debate about whether the ideal of equality is distributive or relational in nature — or indeed both as Rondel argues.

1 The quote in the quote is from Scheffler S (2010) Equality and Tradition. Oxford University Press, p. 191.

2 Anderson EA (1999), "What Is the Point of Equality?," Ethics 109(2): 287-337. 

3 For an overview and analysis of the disagreement, see Lippert-Rasmussen K (2018) Relational Egalitarianism. Cambridge University Press.

4 The quote is from Anderson EA (2010) The Imperative of Integration. Princeton University Press, p. 6.

5 Admittedly, according to Rondel, for James “what really matters is that individuals have good, meaningful lives” (p. 124). This might indicate disagreement with relational egalitarians to the extent that James thought one could have a good, meaningful life even if one does not relate to others as an equal.

6 In the background to Rondel’s failure to distinguish clearly between normative and causal pluralism probably lurks some pragmatist skepticism about the distinction between descriptive and evaluative statements. I do not share this skepticism, but in any case I think my point below can be made independently of it.