Pragmatist Neurophilosophy: American Philosophy and the Brain

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John R. Shook and Tibor Solymosi (eds.), Pragmatist Neurophilosophy: American Philosophy and the Brain, Bloomsbury, 2014, 254pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472511058.

Reviewed by Brian L. Keeley, Pitzer College


This collection is the latest contribution, to the Bloomsbury Studies in American Philosophy, a series whose remit is  to provide a venue for "wholly original arguments, perspectives and research findings" in "cutting-edge scholarship in both the history of and contemporary movements in American philosophy." This is an accurate description of what this collection of ten original papers (plus a short, stage-setting introduction) involves. There seem to be two overarching questions in it. First, what would the classic American pragmatists have made of the current state of the brain sciences? Second, what advice and guidance can contemporary neuroscience find within work falling under the rubric of pragmatism? There are themes that run throughout many of the chapters such as a general rejection of any reductionism of human mind and meaning to the neural, combined with a general naturalist belief that the mind can and should be understood in scientific terms. At the same time, the variety of topics addressed, as well as the different degrees of engagement with the actual theoretical and empirical products of brain science make it very difficult to discuss and sum up the volume succinctly. One is left with the impression that it is very early days in the development of "neuropragmatism."

To my knowledge, there have not been many attempts to create a bridge between pragmatism and neuroscience. Neuroscientist and biological anthropologist Terrence Deacon's exploration of semiotic themes drawn from the seminal pragmatist Charles Sanders Peirce on the origins of language is a rare exception. As philosophical movements go, pragmatism is particularly amenable to the sciences. Peirce's vocation was as a scientist. Other "great names" of pragmatism, William James, John Dewey and George Herbert Mead, were also no strangers to the sciences, be it James' role in the founding of scientific psychology in America, Dewey's interest in pedagogical theory, or Mead's sociological inquiries. Further, the pragmatists were all interested in questions of the mind. Early on, the editors put their hands on the table when it comes to the relevance of these classic American philosophers: "The pragmatists were America's first cognitive scientists" (1).

The volume's contributors are mostly academic philosophers, but three self-identify as (cognitive) psychologists or cognitive neuroscientists. This is primarily a work of philosophy, not neuroscience per se, and the proposed influence is largely unidirectional. The work tends to focus on what neuroscience can learn from pragmatism, and there is relatively little about how the last century of discoveries in the brain sciences should inform philosophical thinking. In this way, the "neurophilosophy" differs from the eliminative or revisionary materialism often associated with the work in the philosophy of neuroscience that followed the 1986 publication of Patricia Churchland's Neurophilosophy. Where Churchland's work (and that of many of those who have followed her) often emphasize the "co-evolution" of brain science and philosophy of mind -- developments in each field correcting and spurring on the other -- Shook and Solymosi begin by noting that

Pragmatism is a perennial philosophy precisely because its core views on experience, cognition, learning, knowledge, values, psychological and education development, interpersonal relationships, and social organization enjoy regular confirmation by evolutionary biology, developmental psychology, experimental sociology, and the brain sciences, including recent developments in neuroscience. (1)

If the neurophilosophy of this volume differs from what has come before under that rubric, then what is it? To answer, it would be helpful to survey what is in the collection and what is not. First, classic American pragmatism is represented: Peirce and James each get early chapters,, John Kaag's "Peirce on Neuronal Synchronicity and Spontaneous Order" and Maxine Sheets-Johnstone's "The Legacy of William James: Lessons for Today's Twenty-first Century Neuroscience".  John Dewey gets the bulk of attention (in some cases paired with his sometimes protégé George Herbert Mead. Missing are Josiah Royce and George Santayana, although given Royce's relatively low contemporary profile and Santayana's tenuous connection to pragmatism this is understandable. Also, while there is some discussion of putative neopragmatists, such as Rorty, Quine and Sellars, they are often mentioned only to explain why they won't be discussed or how they have developed the pragmatic tradition in ways unhelpful for thinking neuropragmatically. So, the pragmatism that is the primary focus is generally classic American pragmatism, particularly the social and embodied pragmatism of Dewey.

That said, one perhaps surprising inclusion is several forays into phenomenology. Or perhaps it should not be surprising in that this largely European philosophical tradition developed contemporaneously with pragmatism and was often driven by similar concerns. As a result, Husserl and Merleau-Ponty (but not Heidegger) appear described as fellow travelers with the American pragmatists in their approach to understanding the mind in terms of how it experiences the world. Also, phenomenology and pragmatism, as philosophical approaches, share a natural antagonism to the analytic approach, which came to dominate Anglo-American philosophy in the years after Dewey and Mead. As both phenomenology and pragmatism see it, analytic philosophy focuses too much on language and concepts, but too little on experience and the embodied self. As such, one gets the impression that one goal of this collection is to take philosophy back to a crucial crossroad in the history of Western, twentieth century philosophy of mind and divert us back to the path that we should have taken, rather than the linguistic turn we did.

This pursuit of the road not taken might explain why the volume largely ignores much of the current literature that goes under the name "neurophilosophy." While Patricia and Paul Churchland get some attention, as well as Andy Clark, many of the names normally associated with contemporary philosophy of neuroscience -- Kathleen Akins, William Bechtel, John Bickle, Carl Craver, Jesse Prinz, etc. -- aren't mentioned. Even the discussion of neurophilosophy as represented by the Churchlands is sometimes at cross purposes. Tiber Solymosi ("Descendents of Pragmatism: Reconciliation and Reconstruction in Neopragmatism, Neurophilosophy, and Neuropragmatism") lumps the Churchlands in as the apotheosis of the analytic tradition (and pillories them for it), whereas Tim Rohrer ("How Inquiry and Method Shape Brain Science: Pragmatism, Embodiment, and Cognitive Neuroscience") ends his discussion of the history of that tradition with Putnam's disembodied, substrate-neutral functionalism. The latter then develops a positive account of the dynamics of embodied neural representation that seeks to show that the specifics of how the brain engages the world undermines functionalist theories of mind, a critique that would make the Churchlands proud.

Complaining that much of contemporary neurophilosophy is ignored may seem churlish, but it does allow me to underline a more substantive disappointment. One hallmark of recent philosophy of neuroscience has been the close attention paid to the details of the empirical and theoretical work in the brain sciences. Indeed, it can be hard to engage with that philosophical literature without also engaging with the neuroscience that it addresses. What, then, is the neuroscience that the authors of this collection choose to engage? Often, the answer, not to put too fine an edge on it, is "popular neuroscience." The neuroscientists discussed here include neuroscientists-turned-popularizers Semir Zeki, Paul Zak, David Eagleman, and Gerald Edelman.

To be fair, this attention to popular accounts is not always a bad thing, as in the case of Mark Tschaepe's "Neuropragmatic Reconstruction: A Case from Neuroeconomics", which details a critique of the work of neuroeconomist Zak, tracking a growing looseness in Zak's scientific claims over time as his publication venues shift from peer-reviewed journals to Scientific American to his recent popular science book. But in other places, the authors miss a trick, as when they focus on Eagleman's more superficial popular work while overlooking his earlier and more rigorous work on how our experience of the passage of time is a function of our degree of arousal or on the perceptual phenomenon of synesthesia. With so many of the contributors interested in the nature of experience, this seems a missed opportunity. To embrace a naturalist account of the mind based in neuroscience, as these authors wish to, you have to come to grips with the often baffling complexity of the science and not just stand back and survey it from a distance.

That said, some of the best papers are ones that do address neuroscience with attention to its details. For example, Sheets-Johnstone's paper on James pairs the philosopher/psychologist's emphasis on the importance of understanding how brain, body and world dynamically interact with Scott Kelso and David Engstrøm's work on understanding the brain in terms of a nonlinear dynamical system. Sheets-Johnstone's career exploring the phenomenology of dance and bodily movement puts her in a good position to explore both James' concern with rhythmic bodily activity -- such as in breathing -- with contemporary neuroscience's focus on rhythmic neural circuitry and the way that nervous system and brain push and pull one another through the medium of the body.

Other papers are interesting pieces of pragmatically inclined philosophy of cognitive science, but it seems a stretch to think of them in terms of neuroscience, per se. For example, David L. Thompson's "The Self as an Evolved Organism that Lives in a Pragmatically Defined World" counts as pragmatist neurophilosophy only in the loosest sense of both terms -- with phenomenologist Merleau-Ponty counting as a pragmatist and ethologist, Jakob von Uexküll as a neuroscientist. Thompson develops a series of toy thought experiments from molecules to amoebas to bees and flowers in order "to play with and clarify some of the most fundamental concepts of life: the emergence of organisms; generality and the categorization of objects; functionality and normativity; and the formation of a niche or world" (204). The result is a fascinating whole-organism-centric account of what a nervous system is: a system that helps an organism engage with a world-for-that-organism (umwelt) that is defined by the organism's needs and abilities rather than by physical principles or the mechanical nature of its constitution.

I do not have the space to survey in detail all the different topics addressed in this volume, including Russell Pryba's Deweyian critique of neuroaesthetics, F. Thomas Burke's exploration of recent work on the extended mind hypothesis, or empirical psychologists Eric Charles, Sabrina Golonka, and Andrew Wilson's argument that "The Most Important Thing Neuropragmatism Can Do" is to provide "an Alternative to 'Cognitive' Neuroscience." This diversity of topics and approaches is both a boon and a burden. On the one hand, there is something here for many cognitive scientists who are looking for approaches to naturalized philosophy of mind that differ from what is found in mainstream functionalist and computationalist cognitive science. This is particularly the case for those concerned to explain cognition in terms that do not start from an assumption that lived experience is unreal or that "reasoning lacks normative authority" (3). (Shook's "Is Experience Subjective or Objective, or Both, or Neither?" scrutinizes this starting point.) But, on the other hand, the authors lament that a lot of neuroscience, specifically, and naturalist accounts of mind, more generally, are not as pragmatically oriented as they feel is necessary. In my opinion, what is missing, despite the appeal of many of the individual pieces, is a clearer story of what neuroscience has to gain from adopting the neuropragmatic perspective more consistently. There are interesting bits and pieces of a neuropragmatic vision, but a more unified story would be welcome. Nonetheless, the different voices and ideas, both historical and contemporary, make for a useful contribution to the ongoing dialogue between philosophy and the neurosciences.