Praise and Blame: Moral Realism and Its Applications

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Robinson, Daniel N., Praise and Blame: Moral Realism and Its Applications, Princeton University Press, 2002, 225pp, $28.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521011558.

Reviewed by David Sussman, Princeton University


In Praise and Blame, Daniel Robinson sets out to defend an account of moral realism sturdy enough to sustain ordinary moral responsibility against the encroachments of various sorts of “moral luck.” His main targets are reductive naturalism about morality, and any sort of Humean theory of action that would dissolve our agency into the causal relations that hold amongst our various psychological and physiological states. For Robinson, moral properties turn out to be like other higher-order features of complex human activity in that they may supervene on natural properties without being reducible to them. Robinson argues that, as rational agents, we have basic powers to grasp and direct our action by considerations of such properties, and it is upon such responsiveness to moral truth that we properly bestow praise and blame. In a broadly Strawsonian vein, Robinson contends that such judgments presuppose only that their object is capable of rational reflection and self-governance, but not any sort of freedom that determinism would deny us. Robinson concludes with an interpretation of moral praise and blame as a kind of rhetoric, by which we strive to either reward and encourage someone for her moral sensitivities, or to spur her through a kind of punishment to be more attentive to the moral reality that is before us all.

Robinson begins by launching a defense of moral realism against moral relativism. “Relativism” is understood quite broadly here, including emotivism, error-theory, and generally any position that betrays some Humean influence. Ayer and Mackie are Robinson’s principal opponents, and there is no mention of the more sophisticated forms of expressivism that have recently been developed by Blackburn and Gibbard. The discussion seems strangely old-fashioned, in that it is directed against a reductionism that is taken to be motivated by little more than logical positivism. In his defense of realism, Robinson argues that there is nothing particularly “queer” or “ineffable” about moral properties, even though moral statements cannot be reduced to non-moral ones or be given anything like a complete set of empirical verification conditions. Rather, some moral property (e.g. “sin,” “integrity,” “intrinsic value”) may be a feature of a naturally constituted situation in much the same way that being a dwelling or a battle is. We can give no reductive analysis of what a dwelling or a battle is in the basic terms of physical science, but this does not show that there are no such things as dwellings or battles or that appeal to them cannot do any real explanatory work.

Praise and Blame never really comes to grips with some of the more interesting motivations for anti-realist approaches to morality. The comparison to dwellings and battles may help to explain how moral properties might supervene on non-moral ones without being reducible to them, but only if there is some further story about what sort of explanatory work appeal to these properties might do. Robinson needs to do more than gesture at this comparison: he needs to say something about how moral properties function in some understanding of ourselves or of the world that makes such supervenience as intelligible in their case as it is in that of dwellings and battles. More important, Robinson seems insensitive to the motivational worries that often drive anti-realism about morality. For Mackie, moral properties seemed ineluctably “queer” because he thought that there would have to be something in the nature of the property itself such that one could not competently ascribe it to something without caring about that thing in the appropriate way. Moral truths were taken to be such that their content would have to immediately necessitate some affective and motivational attitude in anyone who could grasp their meaning. While it is notoriously difficult to specify the sense of necessity in this internalist demand, there does seem to be some intimate connection between morality and our concern that is not found in our basic architectural or military vocabulary. Ultimately, what the internalist wants may be nothing less than some demonstration of the rationality of morality. Robinson, however, dismisses the internalist’s worry because he takes it to be asking for a specification of the causal mechanism by which moral judgments produce action:

To suppose however, that the right moral theory has some special obligation to identify the particular mechanical or biochemical mode of activation is a supposition that would reach comic proportions in any other sphere of significant human endeavor. (p.41).

Yet one does not have be a Humean to think that the realist must show how what makes a moral claim true must also make our concern for it immediately appropriate or intelligible. Not all worries about moral realism can be laid to a crass and superannuated scientism.

Unfortunately, it is never entirely clear just what sort of realism Robinson is defending. His general position seems to be that there are moral truths that are completely prior to our ways of learning, reasoning, or caring about them. Robinson appears committed to a kind of strong Moorean realism about moral properties, although he does not consider the traditional problems of how we could hope to gain knowledge of such things or why we should care about them. Robinson sometimes gestures toward a more Aristotelian kind of perfectionism, where moral truths would be grounded on what human beings need if they are to lead flourishing lives as human beings. Some such perfectionism may well escape the motivational and epistemological difficulties of Moorean realism, but it is unclear that it can maintain the sort of conceptual priority of morality to our attitudes and ways of thinking that Robinson takes to define realism.

Robinson turns from his general defense of realism to a defense of moral responsibility against incompatibalist worries about the freedom of the will. It’s not at all clear what these two topics have to do with each other. Robinson defends the familiar view that to be properly held responsible, we must have the requisite capacities to perceive, understand, and act from our judgments about moral truths, capacities that need not be vitiated by weakness of will, unconscious motivation or self-deception. The view is quite plausible, but there seems to be no argument as to why the moral realist is more readily entitled to it than are any of the various “relativisms” under attack. Robinson seems to be offering a familiar sort of compatibalist account, but he frequently claims to be defending an “incompatibalist-libertarian” view. The terminology is muddled, but Robinson seems to equate the compatibalist with anyone who thinks that it is sufficient for moral responsibility that an agent’s act be caused by the appropriate combination of her desires and beliefs. Robinson’s view would then be incompatibalist insofar as it understands the conditions of responsibility in terms of various powers of rational self-governance that cannot themselves be analyzed into purely mechanistic relations. It’s hard to see what this might have to do with the demand for “contra-causal freedom” normally associated with incompatibalism, and Robinson certainly doesn’t supply any connection. He argues that if determinism implied that we cannot really exercise reason in action, it would also entail that we cannot exercise any reason in thought, thereby undermining any grounds we could have for believing in determinism in the first place. Perhaps Robinson thinks that even the determinist must ascribe to herself rational powers that involve counter-causal freedom. Yet the dialectic only shows that the determinist must accept that the active exercise of reason is something that in general can supervene on processes that are determined on some level of description. The argument is not a refutation of “radical determinism” (as Robinson presents it), but a refutation of the claim that real rational agency would be precluded by such determinism.

Robinson construes praise and blame as forms of reward and punishment, bestowed so as to encourage moral improvement. We are to be praised and blamed not for purely fortuitous features and consequences of our actions, but for the contents of the intentions from which we act, in terms of both the ends we aim at and the sorts of risks to which, if foreseeable, we willingly expose others. The discussion focuses on blame and guilt, ignoring important asymmetries between blame and praise. Robinson denies that we might properly praise someone for her native intelligence or beauty, being apparently unwilling to consider any non-moral forms of praise or blame. He insists that one can feel shame only for moral failings, leaving us to wonder about the person who seems ashamed, and not merely embarrassed, by his poverty, stupidity, or ugliness.

Robinson contends that to act wrongly is to do something that “distorts”, “disfigures”, or “destroys” some moral property. Punishment serves to “repair moral properties” and work “toward the restoration of what the perpetrator has forfeited by way of character.”(p.196). To forgive is to recognize that a wrongdoer has suffered enough by way of punishment (perhaps merely in the experience of his own guilt), and to cease inflicting any more punishment through one’s blame (where the mere assessment of blameworthiness is itself supposed to count as a form of punishment). The picture here is suggestive, but hard to evaluate without more of a story about what character is supposed to be, or what it might be to distort or destroy a moral property. Robinson usually treats character in terms of relatively stable and long-term behavioral dispositions. However, he also seems to consider any intention or choice we make to be part of our character as well, no matter how unrepresentative of our general tendencies it may be. Robinson is similarly unclear as to the sort of moral damage and repair that is at stake. I am not normally blameworthy if I release someone from a debt, even though I have removed some sum of the moral property being owed to someone. On the other hand, A is presumptively blameworthy for shouting a racial insult at B, even though there doesn’t seem to be any interesting sense in which any properties are destroyed or distorted in the act. Certain moral demands have been violated or dishonored, but there is no obvious way to translate this into the quasi-causal language of destruction and disfigurement. B is entitled to respect as a rational, autonomous agent, and nothing A has done changes that. All the moral properties that should have informed A’s action hold in the same way after the insult as they did before. A has perhaps destroyed his own guiltlessness, but since this fact is just a logical consequence of his having performed a blameworthy action, it can hardly serve as an explanation of it. Yet such uninterpreted metaphors of damage and repair are all Robinson gives us to make sense of just what we are supposed to be doing when we take up the reactive attitudes toward others or ourselves.

Praise and Blame is a strangely unfocussed work that flits back and forth amongst a wide array of philosophical topics but fails to sustain any substantive line of argument for very long. Despite all the ground he covers, Robinson leaves us with conclusions that are either fairly jejune versions of familiar positions or hopelessly vague if high-minded gestures. The “moral realism” of the title turns out to be something of a red herring, as there is no serious discussion anywhere in the book about the objectivity, rationality, or epistemology of morality so construed. Rather, such realism seems to be merely an excuse for treating a variety of loosely related (if interesting) topics together. What results is a farrago that does not advance the current debate about moral realism and the moral sentiments, and indeed does not even seem to have caught up with it.