Predicative Minds: The Social Ontogeny of Propositional Thinking

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Radu J. Bogdan, Predicative Minds: The Social Ontogeny of Propositional Thinking, MIT Press, 2009, 156pp., $25.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262026369.

Reviewed by Dan Ryder, University of British Columbia (Okanagan)



The subtitle of this book might lead one to believe that it is about the development of an ability to have thoughts that are propositional, but this is not at all Bogdan’s topic. Although he makes reference to the problem of the unity of the proposition, he does not have in mind the difference between, for example, a mere list of words or set of items designated (“dryer, ruined, clothes”) and a sentence or the proposition it expresses (“The dryer ruined the clothes.”). Nor is Bogdan interested in the grammatical categories of subject and predicate. His apparent target of explanation is closer to the subject in pragmatics that linguists call “topic-comment structure”. Take the sentence

(1) Rufus ate the tuna.

Grammatically speaking, the word “Rufus” is the subject, and “ate the tuna” is the predicate, but either could be topic or comment. The comment typically provides new information about the topic, which is a target of discussion mutually identified by the participants in a conversation. For example, if (1) is a response to the question “What did Rufus do?”, then “Rufus” expresses the topic, and “ate the tuna” the comment. By contrast, if (1) is a response to the question, “Who ate the tuna?”, then the eating of the tuna is the topic and “Rufus” expresses the comment.

Bogdan is interested in how human beings, the only species who manage it, are able to develop the mental competence to direct a comment intentionally at a topic in a way that is intended as an objective description. This is the act that Bogdan takes predication to be, with a predicative utterance or thought being the product of this act. (In the first instance, the predicative competence develops in the context of communication, but intriguingly, Bogdan contends that it forms the foundation for adult thought, at least of a theoretical stripe.) The bulk of the book presents Bogdan’s story of the “developmental staircase”, starting with various innate resources that are assembled through development, with the help of adult cooperation, culminating in the acquisition of the predication competence around the age of two. This competence arises as the child becomes able to communicate linguistically, which ability Bogdan understands along (never questioned) Gricean lines.

While he presents an intriguing series of steps that could explain the development of this kind of predication competence, the book doesn’t make a very good case for its being the correct explanation. I must admit, however, that my confidence in this judgement is not one hundred percent, as Bogdan often does not express himself very clearly. This is caused in part by vagueness (see later in this review), unclear terminology (e.g. “topic-comment structure” is never explained very well), few examples, and failure to connect with the existing literature (for example his understanding of innateness is outdated). So it may be there is more to the project than meets the eye, and I wouldn’t be surprised to learn that initiates into Bogdan’s independent-minded research program1 are convinced that I’ve missed the point. In other words, perhaps I’m just misunderstanding a philosophical maverick, in which case I would be very happy to stand corrected.

I’ll mention at the outset one of my main complaints about the book, which is that it neglects the contemporary literature, especially psychological evidence. Bogdan has a tendency to present controversial claims as though they were established facts, defending them only by mentioning a few hand-picked sources, without explaining the actual evidence to be found in those sources. For example, at the beginning of the first of two chapters in which he presents his “developmental staircase”, he lists what he claims is a “large and diverse body of recent [psychological] literature” on which he will “frequently draw without much further citation” (58). The list is neither large, nor recent. There are a total of eight non-Bogdan sources, including selections from 1963 and 1976. The most recent source is nearly ten years old. (In the entire book, he refers to no more than twenty works in psychology that are newer than this. The situation in philosophy is rather worse, with only ten references newer than twenty years old.) For a book that promises to be steeped in interdisciplinarity, these are rather dubious numbers. (The lack is not the result of a paucity of studies. When I did a PsycINFO search for articles on “intention” in 2 to 23 month-olds, published in the last ten years, I got 206 hits; in the same age group and time period, there were 131 on word learning, 112 on theory of mind, and 106 just on pointing. I also know of later studies done by scientists Bogdan relies upon heavily, studies that would support some of his controversial claims further, but which he ignores.2)

Let’s now consider some of the details of Bogdan’s developmental account of predication. The connection between an infant and its parent that he takes to be foundational for communication is “physiological coregulation”. The parent helps regulate the baby’s bodily state (e.g. temperature and state of nutrition), in response to something like natural signs of those states in the infant (mostly expressions of emotion). Gradually, these interactions become more communicative, as the infant comes to direct its emotional responses toward the parent, and as the parent reacts to those responses with an intent to communicate with the infant. This all sounds quite plausible, so perhaps one may forgive the sparseness of Bogdan’s references here. Nevertheless he also claims that the infant (well before age one) comes to recognize the adult’s intent to produce an effect in the child, and in what he calls “bilateral mental sharing” he goes even further: “the infant becomes aware that the other recognizes and reacts not only to the infant’s smiling but to the sharing itself as well” (60). This remarkable claim needs backing up, and it gets none.

To continue, this “coregulative communication” in which the infant intends to convey its emotions to the adult, and acknowledges the adult’s experiences and responses, allows a number of abilities to develop that are important for predication. These include protoconversation (e.g. taking turns smiling), a sense of mental states as invariants behind behaviour and as having directedness (in this case, towards the infant), and the seeds of a Gricean understanding of communication. Concerning this last, Bogdan gives an example by way of explanation: a mother means for her emotional expression to produce happiness in the child by means of the child recognizing her intent to produce that happiness via her expression. In his intimations of the surprisingly capable Gricean infant here, Bogdan relies heavily upon Michael Tomasello’s work3 but ignores more skeptical views, most notably those of Chris Moore.4 Therefore philosophers unfamiliar with this area of research would do well not to take Bogdan’s word as the received view. (Actually, I’m not even sure that Tomasello would accept some of Bogdan’s more extreme claims about infants’ abilities.)

On the other hand, Bogdan does leave himself an escape clause, if he inclines too far towards optimism about infants’ abilities: all he claims is that children move from a “sense” of the mental in others, to a “sense” of communication, announcing his deliberate use of the word “sense” to allow science to fill in the nature of this “grasping” or representation (64-5). (To appreciate how weak this “sense” could be, realize that he thinks that most species possess a “naive biology” allowing them to have a sense of goal-directedness as a sign of life and agency [71-2].) His notion of “intent” is similarly weak: intents are “mental functions that cause and direct movements and psychological reactions” (59). The problem here is vagueness, both in what Bogdan’s developmental story actually is, and in its argumentative consequences. One can’t help wondering whether the “sense” of predication that 2-year-olds are supposed to have is the same thing as the predication Bogdan claims is central to adult thought.

Moving on, coregulation builds a child’s understanding of shared communicative intent, while something called “protodeclarative communication” builds a child’s awareness of focus on an external object, and mental aboutness. (Here Bogdan relies on some of Elizabeth Bates’ work in the 70’s, again “without much further citation” 65.) “Protodeclarative communication” is helped along by an independently developing awareness of other minds that Bogdan calls “naive psychology”; these two abilities combine to produce a crucial capacity for “shared attention”, where a child and adult intend each other to focus on a particular external object, and they both attend to this object because they recognize this (shared) intention (82). Shared attention allows for comments to be directed at the shared target, where the comments are non-verbal. For instance: the child sees some turnip and thinks it’s yucky (making a face); she draws her father’s attention to the turnip, and they both actively attend to it, each intending the other to continue to do so. They both make faces, agreeing on the comment that the turnip is disgusting. Note that this comment is intentionally directed at the topic (i.e. the turnip); Bogdan calls this “intended directedness” and argues that it is essential to topic-comment structure and predication.

Having gotten this far, the child becomes able to recognize an intent to refer to something - the child recognizes the adult’s intent to refer to the turnip, and the intent to agree with the child that this is what they’re both referring to. Bogdan calls this “coreferential intent”, and it is a crucial achievement. The adult’s next move is to introduce words into this scheme, allowing the child to appreciate that words refer to particular things because both Daddy and I intend them to do so (note the Gricean aspects here). Word acquisition in the context of shared attention turns out to be crucial to the acquisition of the predication competence: the new word is a topic fixer, allowing for non-verbal comments on it. Further, the use of the word is subject to correction, which allows the child to discover that word reference is a matter about which one can be right or wrong, and that words attach to general categories, not just particular things in the context of a particular instance of shared attention. Along with this the child discovers that words aren’t just used imperatively (“Look at this Daddy!”), they are used descriptively, in a publicly accessible way (“That is a turnip!”). This “intended descriptiveness”, Bogdan maintains, is another element essential to predication.

The last steps are for non-verbal comments gradually to be replaced by verbal ones, maintaining both intended descriptiveness and the intended directedness of topic-comment structure. (Without this intended directedness, all you have is “coinstantiation”, not predication. More on this distinction shortly.) All that remains is to separate the child’s productions from the here-and-now of a perceptual situation to conversations that take place in the absence of the items referred to. At that point, the child has achieved full predicative competence.

There are a number of questions that may be raised about Bogdan’s envisaged developmental progression; here are a few. An immediate concern is that many (most?) words are not learned in the rarified context of an adult carefully introducing a name, with shared attention. In response, Bogdan makes it clear that even occasional word learning by this method would be enough to install the predicative competence, as long as the relevant mental schema is extracted. Another question: young children often use language when by themselves in a seemingly referential way (e.g. a child happily talking to herself about the pretend vegetables she’s putting in her soup). Since this is not a context of shared attention, are we to reject these uses as truly referential, and thus useless in building the predicative competence? Bogdan responds that children can make use of a “virtual” coreference relation, whereby they imagine an adult participant. (I worry when he says this is a “key component of the basic idea”, since it sounds ad hoc and implausible 85.) Further, why does Bogdan focus so much on the production side of language? Children apparently understand adult predications long before they’re able to produce their own. He asserts that it is best to firm up the mental scheme for word reference on the production side rather than the comprehension side, but his reasons for this are obscure (86).

The developmental story extends from Chapter 3 to the end of the book. In the first two chapters, Bogdan is concerned to clarify his project by contrasting predication with something he calls (mere) “coinstantiation”, claiming that all previous attempts to give an account of predication in fact only manage to explain coinstantiation. Coinstantiative representations are structured and truth conditional (expressing propositions, albeit merely “coinstantiative” ones), and they involve constituent representations of objects and properties (and categories of these). In fact, they seem to be the sort of thing that philosophers usually have in mind when they think of propositional representations, whether in thought or language. What coinstantiative representations lack, according to Bogdan, are the pragmatic aspects that have been discussed above, including topic-comment structure (plus a presuppositional background found in conversations exhibiting this structure), the active, intended directedness of a comment towards a topic, and intended descriptiveness, whereby there must be an aim to describe or report something objective in a publicly accessible way. These are the items on his “P-list” (7-8).

I found Chapter 2, in which Bogdan criticizes other attempts to account for predication as merely explaining coinstantiation, to be the least successful part of the book. It seems to me that he has simply defined a proprietary sense of “predication”, attached it to the phenomenon he finds of interest (namely topic-comment structure), and then complains that other accounts fail to explain this phenomenon. In fact, these other accounts are not even trying to explain topic-comment structure; for the most part, they are trying to explain how representations can be propositional, a less inflated sense of “predicative”. He goes even further, though, and claims that these accounts could not possibly explain the phenomenon he’s interested in, while failing to give an adequate justification for such an accusation.

For example, he complains that Fodor’s language of thought (LOT) cannot explain predication because there is nothing intrinsic to the language of thought that endows it with the pragmatic features of conversation on his P-list. Well, this should be no surprise; LOT isn’t trying to explain these things. Presumably Fodor et al. would suggest a computational explanation for how LOT sentences figure in causing utterances possessing Bogdan’s P-factors. This pattern of complaint is repeated. Bogdan rejects as unable to explain predication any account of propositional content that does not include “intrinsic features” that also explain the all-important P-factors. This allows him to discard as irrelevant all naturalistic psychosemantic theories, none of which he considers in any detail.5 Similarly, language by itself (construed as a set of symbols plus a grammar) doesn’t have the pragmatic stuff built in either, so language possession can’t explain an ability to “predicate”. What he fails to appreciate is that in any of these cases, one might marshal additional resources in order to explain the P-factors, just as Fodor would make use of computation.

Bogdan’s critiques of yet other accounts of predication are also unsatisfying. Animals can’t predicate (contra Bermúdez), because their mental representations are too closely tied to action. Bogdan knows of no argument “independent of the behavioral evidence of what animals recognize and act on” (what other kind of evidence would one rely on?) that proves their mental representations are “objective and intendingly descriptive … as opposed to egocentric, action-bound, and instrumental” (24). (But representations can be both tied to action and represent distal features.6) The topic-comment structure that Elizabeth Bates finds in active attention cannot amount to predication, because "antecedently, the essential function and intent of a comment is to cause a mental effect in an audience", i.e. it is essential to predication that it develop in a communicative context (37). This is just question begging, as far as I can see.

In many places, it’s clear he thinks there is a vast gulf between “true predication” and “mere coinstantiation” (even saying that they express two different categories of propositions), but he is not very convincing on this point. He protests that predication is not just coinstantiation plus some extra stuff (e.g. computation?), since they have entirely different “mental formats” (13). However, it is unclear what he means by “format”, and I was unable to extract an argument for this claim. The intended directedness is supposed to be an important difference (apparently accounting for different grades of propositional unity), but since he never cashes out the nature of the intent (see my complaint about vagueness above), this doesn’t really help. Early on, it seems coinstantiative thoughts are always merely passive and not under conscious control, by contrast with predicative ones, but he takes this back at the end (12, 133).

Since the importance of the distinction between “true predication” and “mere coinstantiation” does not make it out of the gate, Bogdan’s claim that true predication (as opposed to mere coinstantiation) is the fuel for higher thought rings hollow (xvi). “Higher thought” includes deliberation, planning, theorizing, hypothetical reasoning, introspection, and counterfactual imagination, but nowhere does he present any arguments for why these things are dependent on his pragmatic notion of predication. Towards the end of the book, he even admits the likelihood that many of our thoughts in adulthood are merely coinstantiative (134).

I don’t doubt that Bogdan has identified a genuine phenomenon that requires explanation. What he fails to show is that his account is a competitor to the various theories of propositional thinking that he criticizes. If he had come right out and offered a defense of his account as being the only one that can explain how a thought can be truly propositional, that merely coinstantiative representations fail to express propositions, everything would make a lot more sense. His critiques would really be of opposing views, it would explain why he believes his target phenomenon is the foundation for adult thinking, and his project would be a grand one. As it is, though, one leaves the book with the suspicion that he is trying to explain an interesting but relatively peripheral phenomenon.

1 See Minding Minds: Evolving a Reflexive Mind by Interpreting Others (MIT Press, 2000) and Interpreting Minds (MIT Press, 1997).

2 Elizabeth Bates, B. O’Connell, and C. Shore, “Language and communication in infancy” in: J. Osofsky (ed.), Handbook of Infant Development (Wiley, 1987); U. Liszkowski, M. Carpenter, A. Henning, T Striano, and M. Tomasello, “Twelve-month-olds point to share attention and interest”, Developmental Science 7:3 (2004); H. Moll, and & M. Tomasello, "How 14 and 18- month-olds know what others have experienced", Developmental Psychology, 43 (2007); M. Tomasello, M. Carpenter, M., and U. Lizskowski, “A new look at infant pointing”, Child Development 78 (2007).

3 E.g. The Cultural Origins of Human Cognition (Harvard, 1999).

4 E.g. The Development of Commonsense Psychology (Lawrence Erlbaum, 2006).

5 It is especially surprising that he ignores of Ruth Millikan’s psychosemantic theory, despite the fact that she has much to say about the special articulation of certain kinds of representations that endow them with subject-predicate structure, in Language, Thought, and Other Biological Categories (MIT Press, 1984).

6 Ruth Millikan, “Pushmi-pullyu Representations”, in James Tomberlin (ed.), Philosophical Perspectives, vol. IX (Ridgeview Publishing, 1996).