Preludes to Pragmatism: Toward a Reconstruction of Philosophy

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Philip Kitcher, Preludes to Pragmatism: Toward a Reconstruction of Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2012, 424pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199899555.

Reviewed by Christopher Hookway, University of Sheffield


Philip Kitcher's book consists of a series of essays that illustrate the application of pragmatist ideas to a wide range of topic. The earlier papers discuss metaphysical issues about realism and naturalism, the nature of truth and of the philosophy of mathematics. Others range much more widely, addressing issues of meta-ethics and the application of ethical ideas to matters of vital importance. These topics include the nature of religious experience and issues about secularism and atheism; there is also discussion of topics such as 'Education, Democracy, and Capitalism'.

The book could easily be understood as simply a collection of chapters on a variety of topics, but it is much more than this. It is offered as a defence of pragmatism, or, perhaps better, as an early stage in the development of a systematic defence of a distinctive kind of pragmatism. The term 'preludes' in the title is carefully chosen: Kitcher is not yet ready to present a systematic defence of pragmatism, but he is convinced of the philosophical importance of revisiting pragmatist ideas. He seeks a reconstruction of philosophy, and he holds that work of the pragmatists, especially of John Dewey, provides the materials for this project of reconstruction. Kitcher observes that for much of the twentieth century, pragmatism appeared to be in eclipse. The classical pragmatists appeared to be marginal figures in the history of philosophy; few expected them to make a reasonable contribution to responding to contemporary problems, and even the word 'pragmatism' was rarely used in polite company.

Things have now changed. Serious scholarly attempts to understand the work of Charles Sanders Peirce, William James, and John Dewey are now widespread and recognized as valuable; understanding how those philosophers understood their problems can contribute to understanding our problems. Moreover, important contemporary thinkers are now ready to describe themselves as pragmatists and to find the term valuable in characterising contemporary movements in philosophy. The figures who engage with pragmatism are among the leading figures in philosophy: Richard Rorty, Hilary Putnam, Robert Brandom, Huw Price, and Philip Kitcher. There are also books engaging with 'the new pragmatists'. As its title indicates, Kitcher provides a series of preliminary studies that provide resources for a more systematic engagement with pragmatism. What is the pragmatism for which these preludes should prepare us?

It is important that the first chapter is entitled 'The Importance of Dewey for Philosophy (and for Much Else Besides)'. Kitcher begins his preface by saying 'Classical pragmatism is . . . not only America's most important contribution to philosophy but also one of the most significant developments in the history of [philosophy].' (p. xi). His opening descriptions of Dewey's work give the reader a framework for what is distinctive and important in his view of pragmatism. At the same time, Kitcher emphasises some of the most important differences between analytical philosophy and classical pragmatism. Analytic philosophers give a central role to issues about meaning: logical positivists sought to overcome a priori metaphysics by showing that it was meaningless, and, more generally, analytic philosophers sought accounts of representation, accounts of how thought and reality are related. Kitcher is emphatic that this approach to philosophy is mistaken. We should be interested in the roles of words and concepts in our practices; for example, we try to clarify our concept of truth by tracing its relations to activities such as belief, assertion and inquiry.  Doing this is not a matter of traditional philosophical analysis. The concepts we use can be sensitive to our values and interests, and the concepts we employ will depend upon the practices we engage in and the problems we find ourselves needing to resolve. As Kitcher puts it, the philosopher's understanding 'is not limited to the writings of contemporary specialists in some sub-branch of the academic profession, but should draw widely from many areas' (p. xv). The first thing we must do is 'to understand the questions posed for us by the circumstances of our lives and by the conditions of contemporary inquiry' (p. xv).

In addition to emphasizing the importance of Dewey, Kitcher exploits James's ideas about truth, morality and the philosophy of religion. But it may be more significant that the introduction leads us 'From Naturalism to Pragmatic Naturalism'. I shall consider just when naturalism becomes pragmatic and try to identify just what are the influences of Dewey and Peirce. However, the book also offers rich and important discussions of realism, the correspondence theory of truth and the philosophy of mathematics, as well as of race, secularism and atheism, education and democracy, capitalism, and altruism.

I shall begin with pragmatic naturalism and the influence of Dewey. Kitcher is particularly impressed by Dewey's search for 'Reconstruction in Philosophy', and for 'revisionary' approaches to philosophy. Kitcher thinks we should forge new vocabularies for forming new philosophical problems. He also expects us to learn methodological lessons from inquiries in disciplines other than professionalised "normal philosophy". Moreover, he expects new philosophical problems to emerge from such inquiry and hopes that philosophy will enable us to dispose of them. As he puts it, he hopes that philosophy will enable us to 'avoid mysteries rather than multiplying them.' (p. xv). The adoption of this Deweyan outlook is evident from the last three chapters, which respond to contemporary social problems.

The seventeen long chapters and introduction provide us with challenging treatments of most issues that are important for contemporary analytic philosophy. After the celebration of the importance of Dewey's insistence on the importance of a reform of philosophy, there are lengthy and important defences of naturalism and realism and discussions of how realism and pragmatism can be reconciled. Some of these chapters will already be well known to many readers, but their richness rewards a further reading. Kitcher's second hero, alongside Dewey, is William James, and his influence is prominent in 'On the Explanatory Role of Correspondence Truth'. Kitcher aims to 'demystify the notion of reference, and, derivatively, that of correspondence.' (139). He holds that 'pragmatists can accept the correspondence account of truth that James found in his dictionary' (p. 139), and that we can make sense of this in a way that explains the importance of 'world-adjusting success.' (p. 136). We avoid the threat that a Jamesian approach to truth will lead to subjectivism as soon as we take seriously the importance of 'scientific inquiry (broadly construed) in human projects.' (p. 144).  Subsequent chapters are designed to defend the plausibility of this view.

The fifth chapter attempts to reconcile pragmatism and realism. It has long been argued that pragmatist accounts of truth are not offered as philosophical analyses of that concept. Rather, pragmatist accounts describe how the concept is used in particular contexts: we only describe propositions as true when we expect their use to have beneficial consequences. Later chapters use pragmatist ideas for other purposes. For example, chapter six offers a sophisticated and fascinating discussion of whether the concept of race is one that we should retain. As Kitcher puts it, we should reject 'a realist approach to natural kinds.' (p. 164). Instead, 'the legitimacy of notions of race has to depend upon the suitability of those notions to our purposes.' (p. 164). And once we address the issue in this spirit, 'matters are far more complicated than they initially appear.' (p. 164).

The breadth of Kitcher's interests become ever more evident as the book develops. A valuable discussion of mathematical truth based on Paul Benacerraf's paper on 'Mathematical Truth' is followed by chapters on Carnap, on James's defence of religion, on secularism and on atheism before we encounter chapters on altruism, on naturalistic ethics, on democracy and on public knowledge. As I indicated above, Kitcher aspires to write a systematic defence of pragmatism, but his book can only provide 'preludes', a sequence of essays that demonstrate the richness of pragmatist approaches in a wide variety of areas of philosophy.

I will not be alone in looking forward to the sequel, to Kitcher’s account of how he will develop a systematic pragmatist approach to philosophy.  The individual chapters provide evidence of the strength of pragmatist ideas: Kitcher adopts a broadly Jamesian approach to truth and an instrumentalist understanding of concepts and theories. He also follows the classical pragmatists in exploring the nature of religious experience and in rejecting any sharp dichotomy between science and religion. Throughout, Kitcher draws on the pragmatist tradition, most of all in his views about just what the task of philosophy is. And in doing this, he articulates a powerful understanding of why a reconstructed form of philosophy is so important.

Preludes to Pragmatism is an important and rewarding book. Individual chapters make important contributions to current philosophical issues. We learn something about pragmatism by exploring the ways in which pragmatist themes are manifested in the discussions of the individual chapters, and the book presents a distinctive alternative for philosophers sympathetic to pragmatism.