Preparation for Natural Theology: With Kant's Notes and the Danzig Rational Theology Transcript

Placeholder book cover

Johann August Eberhard and Immanuel Kant, Preparation for Natural Theology: With Kant's Notes and the Danzig Rational Theology Transcript, Courtney D. Fugate and John Hymers (eds. and trs.), Bloomsbury, xlviii+279pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474213837.

Reviewed by Stephen R. Palmquist, Hong Kong Baptist University


This is the second in a series of planned books whose purpose is to produce English editions of many of the key sources that Kant used in his teaching and in the development of his philosophical system. The series will do much to further and deepen the historical accuracy of English-language Kant-scholarship, especially works such as the one featured here, by Johann August Eberhard, which Kant used as a textbook for his course on rational theology. When used in conjunction with the published lecture notes written by Kant’s students (one example of which appears in the present collection), the translation of Eberhard’s text enables English readers to assess more accurately which theories and arguments are Kant’s and which he borrowed or adapted from his sources. In the above-mentioned course Kant’s primary sources were the texts of Eberhard (translated here) and Alexander Gottlieb Baumgarten (translated in the first book in this series).

The book contains four main parts: the lexical apparatus (including a Translators’ Introduction, footnotes to the other three parts, two “Concordances”, two Glossaries, and two indexes) provided by Courtney D. Fugate and John Hymers (the editors and translators) and their translations of three texts: Eberhard’s Preparation; the notes Kant wrote in his personal copy of Eberhard’s book, mostly on blank pages that were interleaved between the book’s printed pages; and the previously untranslated Danzig lecture notes on rational theology, written by one or more of Kant’s students. I will describe and evaluate each of these four parts in turn.

The Translators’ Introduction begins with an informative account of Eberhard’s life and work. While he never quite made it into the top tier of most influential philosophers in the German Enlightenment, his influence was significant, largely due to his acquaintance and in some cases close friendships with many major philosophers during the third quarter of the Eighteenth Century. Defending a trend known as “neology” (p.xvi) that adopted an approach to philosophy and religion that Kant was later to dub “pure supernaturalism”, one of his goals was to appraise Christianity, discarding some revealed doctrines as irrational while defending others. Worth noting, though not mentioned by the editors, is that Eberhard’s approach stands in marked contrast to Kant’s: as stated in The Conflict of the Faculties, Kant’s aim in his 1793 book, Religion within the Bounds of Bare Reason, was entirely philosophical, to set forth the necessary conditions that any religion must meet in order to be worthy of belief; when he claimed to “make no appraisal of Christianity” (7:8), leaving biblical theologians to perform the task of appraising their doctrinal system, he was surely thinking (at least in part) of Eberhard’s contrasting approach to philosophy.

Fugate and Hymers present a good summary of key features of three of Eberhard’s main writings, including his 1776 prize essay that was awarded first place by the Berlin Academy. One significant point which the editors mention twice (pp.xxix,xxxiii; cf. pp.2,61) but do not emphasize is that Eberhard held a view of intuition that would have qualified as an example of the intellectual intuition that Kant denied from 1781 onwards. What their summary of Eberhard’s works does highlight (p.xxxiv) is “that both Eberhard and Kant . . . see themselves ultimately as providing an apology for Plato.” However, while they provide ample evidence that this applies to Eberhard, they merely assume it is common knowledge that Kant was a Platonist. The fact that Kant’s use of the term “supersensible” from 1781 onwards is taken directly from Eberhard and that both thinkers saw metaphysics as “culminat[ing] in transcendental theology” (p.xxxiv), however, should not lead us to forget that Kant transformed the Platonic tradition while Eberhard left it mostly intact — a crucial difference that they only hint at.

Unfortunately, the Translators’ Introduction provides no summary account of Eberhard’s Preparation (Akademie Ausgabe [hereafter AA] 18:491-606) and only a brief comment on the contents of Kant’s related Reflexionen (AA 18:489-606), despite these being the main two texts translated in this book. (See below for my summaries of both.) Instead, they jump from a summary of Eberhard’s earlier works to a brief explanation of various lexical issues relating to Kant’s Reflexionen. After lecturing on rational theology once in 1774, Kant returned to the subject and lectured on it three more times during the mid-1780s. While the editors do not draw such inferences explicitly, it seems likely that one motivation for Kant’s return to lecturing on this subject was the publication of Eberhard Preparation in 1781, and that his decision to stop offering the course was related to Eberhard’s decision to publish a journal that focused on attacking Kant’s critical philosophy.

Section 5 of the Introduction explains how Fugate and Hymers deal with seven sets of problems relating to difficult vocabulary issues. They mostly stick to conventional translations adopted by the Cambridge Edition (hereafter CE) translators. Their choices of when to depart from these (sometimes potentially misleading) conventions are generally good, though some of their explanations are too short to be fully informative. A notable exception is their departure from the recent convention of translating forms of “Erkenntnis as “cognition”: they revert to Norman Kemp Smith’s “knowledge”. To distinguish Erkenntnis from Wissen, they often add an extra word (e.g., “discursive” or “apodictic”), as well as inserting the German whenever a confusion might arise; unfortunately, their lengthy explanation gives no account of various similar words, such as “Kenntnis”, which refers to a more general sort of awareness but which they translate (very questionably) as “proficiency” (p.1). Similarly, their distinction between Moral and Moralität is essential, but they give no account of the many other closely-related words with distinct meanings. More (and longer) entries of this sort would have been helpful. Among several notable omissions is a failure even to mention that Kant has two terms for objects, Objekt and Gegenstand (cf. p.250), which have distinct connotations in the Danzig lecture notes.

The Introduction ends with three short sections: information on the original texts; a list of abbreviations and conventions for textual mark-up; and a two-page Bibliography consisting mostly of works relating to Eberhard. The ample footnotes throughout the translated texts are mostly clarifications of translation issues or helpful glosses on the sources that Eberhard, Kant, or his student(s) refer to. The book ends with two (misleadingly labelled) “Concordances”, two Glossaries (German-English and English-German), and two detailed Indexes. Rather than consisting of a list of the occurrences of words in context, “Concordance 1” lists the section headings in Eberhard’s Preparation, with four columns specifying page numbers for his original German edition, those of the AA 18 edition, the corresponding page numbers of the Danzig lecture notes (AA 28.2.2), and the corresponding numbers of Kant’s Reflexionen (AA 18), while “Concordance 2” provides a useful comparison of the corresponding pages of three sets of student lecture notes: Pölitz, Volckmann, and Danzig (all in AA 28.2.2). These lexical aids are not concordances; nevertheless, they are especially useful because the editors present the texts of Eberhard’s Preparation and Kant’s Reflexionen separately, whereas in AA 18 the two texts overlap, with corresponding Reflexionen appearing in close proximity to the pages of Preparation to which they refer. This separate layout makes both texts easier to read, but a drawback is that separating them so completely makes it more difficult for readers to trace connections between Eberhard’s text and Kant’s commentary on (or extension of) it. Not much is sacrificed by this decision, however, because the connections between Kant’s notes and Eberhard’s text are often minimal, and where the connection is of paramount importance, the editors call attention to this in a footnote. While the so-called “Concordances” are helpful reference tools, readers therefore may not need to refer to them frequently, if at all.

Although it contains very little philosophical argument as such, Eberhard’s textbook is a wide-ranging summary of literature on philosophical theology over the foregoing century. What the book lacks in depth it makes up in comprehensive coverage. In each subsection Eberhard explicitly lists the main sources, mostly in Latin, German, and English, and typically provides a sentence or short paragraph summarizing each main option on any given position. These include two citations of Kant’s own previous work — perhaps one reason Kant liked using it as a textbook? After an Introduction explaining his strategy and outlining the book’s contents, Eberhard divides his study into two parts: the theoretical part has four sections, examining “the Internal Truth of the Concept of God” (via a priori proofs), “the External Truth” of that concept (via a posteriori proofs), “the errors that arise from the defects of religious knowledge” (including atheism, polytheism, and religious superstition), and “the natural history of religion” (p.9); and the much shorter practical part examines two aspects of “the communication of religious knowledge” (sensible communication through miracles, and rational communication through either natural knowledge or philosophical learning).

Those familiar with Kant’s mature religious writings will find that many of his favorite distinctions and themes have forerunners in Eberhard’s textbook. For example, Kant’s Religion (6:155f) echoes a distinction Eberhard makes from his Introduction’s first sentence onwards, between religion’s rational origin and its “rules for communication” (p.3). Kant’s elaboration of the second component of this distinction, in Religion‘s Fourth Piece, builds on Eberhard in several key respects, such as his claims that “superstition can arise from faulty instruction” and that this is exacerbated when believers “hold such truths to be internal sensations, and accept them to be true as immediate experience” (p.57), thus giving rise to “religious enthusiasm” (p.58) — or (as I prefer to translate “Schwärmerei”) delirium. Indeed, Eberhard’s influence even goes beyond Kant’s Religion, for at one point he expresses in seed form what Kant later developed into his mature theory of the highest good: God distributes happiness in proportion to each person’s virtue (p.64; cf. p.87 for Kant’s Reflexion on the same topic). Nevertheless, the differences between Preparation and Religion could not be more obvious: while the former is essentially an annotated Bibliography on philosophical theology, the latter is a sustained argument in defense of a way of being religious that can hold true for all human beings.

Kant’s Reflexionen on Eberhard’s Preparation also could hardly be more different from the textbook itself. Indeed, the explicit connections between them are the exceptions rather than the rule. Kant apparently regarded Eberhard’s work as an excellent complement to his own strengths: Kant performed no aspect of his work as a scholar more poorly than directing his readers to his sources, whereas this was Eberhard’s forte. Consequently, Kant’s lecture notes lead the reader into depths of argument and other conceptual considerations that are only barely touched upon (if at all) in the textbook between whose pages they were written. To readers of Kant’s 1763 work, The Only Possible Argument, much of the material in these Reflexionen will seem familiar, as Kant focuses on introducing his students to his own “possibility proof”, whereby everything possible exists as a limitation of God, conceived as ens realissimum (“the most real being”). He develops it, however, in some new and interesting ways. At AA 18:495 (pp.72-73) and elsewhere, for example, he clarifies the role of the principle of excluded middle in establishing the ens realissimum: whereas ordinary empirical knowledge involves the determination of predicates in relation to a particular object through an analytic exclusion of the given predicate’s opposite, the concept of the thorough determination of predicates holds in relation to an object in general and constitutes metaphysical knowledge through a synthetic inclusion that appears — though Kant is not entirely explicit about this — to suspend this key principle of Aristotelian logic.

In these Reflexionen (dating from 1783 to 1788) we also see Kant developing the fundamentals of many aspects of the theory of religion that he was to publish 5-10 years later, in Religion. At one point, for example, Kant refers to the ens realissimum as “the archetype [Urbild]” (p.71; AA 18:493), a connection that could have significant implications for our understanding of Kant’s theory of conversion through faith in the archetype, in Religion‘s Second Piece (see also p.124; AA 18:598). Indeed, one longer Reflexion (pp.124-125; AA 18:598-601) reads like an early draft of crucial arguments in Section One of Religion’s Second Piece, including a clear foreshadowing of Kant’s moral reinterpretation of the doctrine of vicarious atonement, whereby God, “through the ideal of humanity, supplements what righteousness we are lacking.” (The translators unfortunately render Kant’s “Gerechtigkeit as “justice” — one of its two possible meanings, but clearly not what Kant intends here!) He also approves of restrained government control of religion to enhance its moral agenda (p.80; AA 18:504-505), refers in passing to a community under a divine legislator (p.74; AA 18:496), gives an early version of what would later become his standard definition of religion (p.87; AA 18:515), makes his crucial distinction between philosophical and revealed/learned theology (p.88; AA 18:516), and proposes basic definitions of key terms such as “superstition” and “Schwärmerei” (p.81-82; AA 18:506-507). His definition of the latter, as the act of accepting irrational experience as if it were a principle of reason (i.e., a properly justified idea to guide our understanding) provides a good rationale for not following CE by translating “Schwärmerei” as “enthusiasm”; indeed, Kant here states that Schwärmerei “is madness” and goes on to call it a “delusional” form of “supposed derangement” (p.83; AA 18:508), thus clearly suggesting that the term “delirium” applies more aptly than either “enthusiasm” or the once-standard “fanaticism”. Kant’s three Reflexionen on Part Two of Eberhard’s text (pp.126-129; AA 18:601-606) are longer than Eberhard’s original text, and almost every sentence relates closely (sometimes almost verbatim) to what Kant went on to write in the Third and Fourth Pieces of Religion. The one major blemish on what is otherwise an excellent contribution to scholarship on Kantian theology and religion is that Fugate and Hymers passed up a golden opportunity to trace such fascinating correlations in their Introduction.

The final text, entitled the “Danzig Rational Theology According to Baumbach”, largely overlaps with the more commonly cited Pölitz lecture notes on philosophical theology, translated in CE. Compared to Pölitz, Danzig is annoyingly repetitive in places, sometimes reading as if it were a compilation of notes written by several different students, which were not properly edited for consistency by their compiler. While this is no fault of Fugate and Hymers, it does explain why the CE editors selected the Pölitz lectures instead. Nevertheless, the Danzig notes include plenty of gems — describing delirium as the religious error of not “know[ing] the boundaries” (p.135), clarifying that only arguments appealing to the ens realissimum count as a “transcendental proof” of God’s existence (pp.144-145), that the ontological and cosmological arguments abstract in different directions from this central ground (p.157), that God’s understanding can be unlimited only by being intuitive (pp.149,153,165), that unlike humans God’s Erkenntnis suffices as Wissen (p.174; cf. p.170), and much more — to justify high praise to Fugate and Hymers for doing a great service to English-language Kant-scholarship by translating it. All in all, their entire book is a must read for anyone interested in a scholarly understanding of the historical origins of Kant’s theology and theory of religion.