Presumption and the Practices of Tentative Cognition

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Nicholas Rescher, Presumption and the Practices of Tentative Cognition, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 181pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521864747.

Reviewed by Robert Koons, University of Texas at Austin


In this book Rescher addresses a set of important topics in epistemology, all involving the notion of defeasible presumption. These topics include: the burden of proof, the pragmatic justification of presumption, default reasoning, the role of presumption in communication and in science, and the relationship between defeasibility and coherence theories of truth and warrant. Rescher assumes too much familiarity with the concepts and terminology of philosophy for this book to be useful in an introductory level course. At the same time, there is too little that is both substantive and novel for the book to be of interest at the graduate or professional level. The book would work well, however, as a textbook for an upper-level course in epistemology, as long as it was used as one of several texts, and especially if the instructor has an interest in covering topics beyond the usual issues of skepticism, internalism vs. externalism, and so on. As is usual for Rescher, the book is written in a lucid and elegant style, and he brings considerable erudition to the task, covering fields as disparate as law, psychology and computer science.

For the most part, Rescher's arguments for his positions are persuasive.  I would find fault on just three points: first, his exclusively pragmatic justification for the presumption of simplicity in science and other theoretical inquiries; second, his tendency to relapse on occasion into an excessively positivistic conception of truth; thirdly, his identification of a presumption-based epistemology with coherentism.

On the issue of the rationale for simplicity, Rescher correctly observes that we follow an injunction of giving preference to simpler hypotheses over complex ones. He argues that this preference can be construed only as "a procedural, regulative principle of presumption," and not as "a metaphysical claim as to the 'simplicity of nature.'" (p. 40) This strikes me as a false dilemma. The preference for simplicity could be both a regulative norm and a tacit assertion about the deep structure of reality.

Rescher offers a purely pragmatic justification for the preference for simple theories in science. "Simpler (more systematic) answers are more easily codified, taught, learned, used, investigated, and so on." (p. 126) "The rational basis for preferring inductive simplicity lies in considerations of the economic dimension of practice and procedure rather than in any factual supposition about the world's structure." (p. 127) Rescher doesn't consider, however, whether this position is compatible with the proposition that scientific theory provides us with knowledge about nature. Since theory is always underdetermined by data, the preference for simplicity plays a permanent and ineliminable role in theory choice. Consequently, if simpler theories are in reality no more likely than complex ones to be true, then the scientific method is radically unreliable (even in the infinite long run) and thus no source of knowledge.

Rescher argues that principles of presumption (like the preference for simplicity) can receive a kind of epistemic support in the form of "experiential retrovalidation." (p. 52) He frankly concedes the obvious problem with such a notion: namely, that of a vicious circularity, since the empirical conclusions used to "retrovalidate" the principles of presumption were reached using those same principles. (p. 57) Perhaps in recognition of this fact, he argues that "the validation of our presumptions is not really theoretical but practical." (p. 54) This again strikes me as a false dichotomy. A belief about which principles are most likely to be practically successful is itself as much a theoretical belief as any other (as Plato argued in the Theaetetus). How could a set of rational conclusions about epistemic practices be "non-theoretical"? Are questions of truth and falsity supposed to be somehow less salient when practical matters are at stake? Shouldn't they rather be more salient then?

Turning to Rescher's vestigial positivism, I find his tendency to compare presumption and truth as though they were determinates of a common determinable to be a kind of category mistake. For example, Rescher argues that "retrovalidation" is not viciously circular, since he is supposing only that "the thesis whose antecedent status is a mere presumption should ultimately acquire the consequent status of a truth." (p. 58) A proposition doesn't become true as a result of being supported by new evidence, nor are mere presumptions somehow lacking in truth value: instead, our belief in the truth of certain propositions acquires through new evidence a new epistemic status. Here is a second example of the same mistake. Rescher claims that a "datum is a proposition to be taken not as true, but as potentially or presumptively true." (p. 70) Rescher's error here is to suppose that 'presumptively' is a modifier of truth rather than of our taking: we presumptively take a proposition to be true simpliciter, we do not take (without qualification) a proposition to be presumptively-true.

Rescher identifies a "presumption-based" epistemology with coherentism, and contrasts it with a foundationalist epistemology, with its basic "truths of fact" that are apprehensible immediately and with certainty. (p. 69) Here Rescher seems to be confusing two distinct issues: coherentism vs. foundationalism, and presumptive certainty vs. apodeictic certainty. It is quite possible for a foundationalist to hold (with Chisholm) that all of the properly basic beliefs in the foundation are presumed to be true rather than held with indefeasible, apodeictic certainty. The case of Chisholm's presumption-based foundationalism demonstrates the falsity of Rescher's implicit dichotomy.

The principal challenge to a coherentism of the kind defended by Rescher (dating back to Russell at least) is that it is perfectly possible for a set of falsehoods to be mutually coherent. Rescher counters by insisting that a system of propositions is true only if its members cohere both with one another and with experience (p. 74). However, experiences too can be illusory. Cohering with a set of experiential illusions is no guarantee of truth. Hence, truth cannot be identified with any sort of coherence.

Rescher's discussion of default reasoning (chapter 6) is valuable, but the most recent of his citations are to articles from the mid-80's. Quite a bit of work on the formalization of defeasible reasoning -- especially connections between models of defeasible reasoning and theories of extreme (infinitesimal) probabilities -- has been done in the last fifteen years. (See my article on "Defeasible Reasoning" in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy.)

Rescher provides an interesting account of a feature often noted in discussions of default reasoning: our preference for rules with specific conditions over more generic rules.  Rescher argues that this preference can be explained simply by observing, "When other things are anything like equal, it is clearly easier for error to gain entry into a larger than into a smaller manifold of claims." (p. 141) This plausible explanation points to the value of recent attempts to provide probabilistic models for patterns of default reasoning.

Rescher argues that our preference for specificity over generality is reversed when dealing with counterfactual scenarios. According to Rescher, "When we play fast and loose with the world's facts we need the security of keeping the fundamentals [general laws] in place." (p. 149) This seems initially plausible, but surely something deeper than our need for security is involved in our holding fixed the causal laws and potentialities of things in counterfactual supposition.

Rescher attempts to argue that human epistemological practices have been shaped by two similar but distinct forms of evolution: one driven by natural selection (biological evolution) and the other by rational selection (cultural selection). I doubt that there is any useful analogy between the two sorts of processes. In addition, Rescher makes a number of unsubstantiated assertions about which features of our cognitive equipment are due to which process. For example, Rescher asserts that "our belief in the causal efficacy of physical occurrences" is not grounded in our biological nature. (p.99) The universality of this belief, and its clear relevance to survival and reproduction, undermine any basis for confidence in Rescher's insouciance.

In his chapter on "Presumption and Elites", Rescher offers an implausible reduction of normativity to sociological facts about networks of deference. A "second-order elite" consists of those members of a community whose expertise is most commended by the "first-order elite", namely, those whose expertise is most commended by the population in general. Rescher claims that "normativity comes into operation with positive second-order elites." (p. 135) Rescher gives us the following examples of how second-order expertise "engenders" normativity:

·      Among people, those esteemed by the most esteemed are indeed esteemable.

·      Among articles, those cited by the most cited are important (citation-worthy).

·      Those people deemed expert by those deemed expert deserved to be seen as experts.

Rescher never makes clear how we are to take these "principles": as epistemically useful rules of thumb, or as analytic of normative concepts. He seems to be arguing for the latter, claiming that these theses "effect a transit" from subjectivity to objectivity, and from factuality to normativity, giving us grounds for holding that "normativity supervenes on factuality." (p. 136) Understood in this way, Rescher's claims are vulnerable to G. E. Moore's open-question argument.  It certainly seems conceivable that second-order elites might err. Why should the general population be thought to be essentially infallible at the task of identifying those who are infallible detectors of infallible judges of normativity? In addition, Rescher never explains why we should stop at "second-order" elites. Why not third-order? Fourth-order? Omega-order?