Prevention vs. Treatment: What's the Right Balance?

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Halley S. Faust and Paul T. Menzel (eds.), Prevention vs. Treatment: What's the Right Balance?, Oxford University Press, 2012, 397pp., $49.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780199837373.

Reviewed by J. Paul Kelleher, University of Wisconsin-Madison


Prevention vs. Treatment: What's the Right Balance? is a collection of 15 essays on various aspects of the perennial tension in health policy between treatment and prevention. There is also a substantial introduction by the two editors, one of whom (Faust) is a preventive medicine physician and President-elect of the American College of Preventive Medicine; the other (Menzel) is a philosopher who has made important and influential contributions to bioethics, health policy, and health economics. The collection is divided into three roughly equal parts: Part One, "Evidence, Policy, and History;" Part Two, "Philosophical and Legal Analysis;" and Part Three, "Religious and Cultural Perspectives."

The volume's introduction invites readers to think of the central issue in rather broad terms. Its opening example contrasts the spare-no-expense urgency displayed when a child falls into a well with the lower priority given to preventing such terrible fates in the first place. Some readers may be disappointed, then, to discover that the empirical essays in Part One focus almost exclusively on the evidence, policy, and history of clinical prevention (e.g., vaccinations, screening, counseling about aspirin prophylaxis, cholesterol management, etc.). One of these essays even remarks in passing that "clinical prevention [is] the theme of this volume" (78). By contrast, none of the essays in Parts Two and Three share this narrow focus on the clinical.

For reasons of space, the remainder of this review focuses on just one of the empirical papers in Part One, and then on the philosophical and legal essays in Part Two. Regrettably, I am unable to discuss the interesting and informative essays in Part Three.

The second essay in Part One is by Louise B. Russell and is titled "Prevention vs. Cure: An Economist's Perspective on the Right Balance." Russell is a highly respected economist who has published widely on the costs and effectiveness of preventive medical services and on various methodological issues in health economics. Her essay is exceedingly well written, conveying both authority in her subject matter and pedagogical concern for the reader who comes to health-economics for the first time. I suspect many readers will judge Russell's essay the gem of Part One (and perhaps even of the entire volume). As I will explain, however, I worry that the orthodox economic framework Russell employs is poorly suited to evaluate the balance between prevention and treatment.

Russell's boldest and most intriguing thesis is that "the balance between prevention and cure, at least in the medical sector, may not be so far wrong after all" (75). This claim stems from studies (some by Russell herself) that show prevention and treatment are by and large equally cost-effectiveCost-effectiveness analysis (CEA) is a health economic framework that compares a given intervention's monetary cost with its expected health benefit. Health benefits are usually measured in quality-adjusted life-years (QALYs), which combine quality-of-life and longevity into one metric by multiplying a given health state's quality score by the time (in years) spent living in that state. Quality scores range from zero ("as bad as death") to 1 ("full health"). So one year lived in full health generates 1 QALY; living in full health for half a year generates 0.5 QALYs; and living for one year in a state one-third as good as full health generates 0.33 QALYs. CEA is thus one measure of efficiency in health: by ranking interventions in terms of their cost-per-QALY (i.e., their cost-effectiveness ratio), CEA shows how to get the most health-related bang for our buck. Interventions with very small ratios (i.e., low costs per QALY) are said to be very cost-effective.

Now philosophers have raised lots of worries about CEA, but they have mostly ignored a feature of it that is especially relevant to the prevention vs. treatment debate.[1] That feature is this: cost-effectiveness studies virtually never evaluate the overall efficiency of the prevailing mix of covered interventions (e.g., the mix currently covered by Medicare); they instead answer the narrower question of how much more expensive and/or more beneficial a new intervention is when compared to the current standard of care for a specific health problem. Thus, standard CEAs evaluate new interventions in terms of their incremental cost-effectiveness, i.e., the ratio of the new intervention's additional costs to itsadditional benefits. As Russell explains,

Each cost-effectiveness ratio compares two alternatives that could be applied to the same health problem. Often, the comparison is between a new approach, preventive or therapeutic, and the standard approach to the same problem, which again may be preventive or therapeutic (59).

This method of evaluating an intervention's cost-effectiveness can have problematic implications. To illustrate, consider a very stylized example. Suppose that some current treatment T costs our health plan $200 per year (total, not per person) and generates 1 QALY, and that some new and improved treatment T* would cost $1,000 and generate 81 QALYs. A standard CEA will then report that T*'s incremental cost-effectiveness is $10 per QALY (since T* uses 800 additional dollars and yields 80 additional QALYs, when compared to T). Suppose also that some current preventive service P (which prevents a totally different health problem) costs $200 and generates 20 QALYs, and that a new and improved preventive service P* would cost $1,000 and generate 100 QALYs. Thus P*'s incremental cost-effectiveness is also $10 per QALY. Now here's the problem: if we use the methodology underlying Russell's main thesis, we will conclude that T* and P* are equally cost-effective, despite the fact that $1,000 spent on P* yields 100 QALYs while the same $1,000 spent on T* would yield only 81 QALYs. Of course, one could compare T* with P* (and T with P), but this is not done in practice because they address completely different health problems.

As this example illustrates, and as economists at the World Health Organization note, the use of incremental CEA "means that major allocative inefficiencies may not be evaluated and thus not identified."[2] Incremental CEA therefore seems ill suited to the problem Russell is addressing, which is "to find the most effective mix, the one that makes the best use of our resources to improve health and extend life, whether through prevention or treatment" (74). If one really wishes to reassess the prevailing mix of prevention vs. treatment (as this volume clearly intends), incremental cost-effectiveness ratios are not the right tools to use.

Part Two of the volume, "Philosophical and Legal Analysis," opens with "Our Alleviation Bias: Why Do We Value Alleviating Harm More than Preventing Harm?" by Faust. The essay uses a series of thought experiments to support the "empirical/descriptive claim" that we frequently prioritize treatment over prevention because of the "overwhelming moral emotion" of compassion (141). I fear many readers (especially health policy folks, but even some philosophers) will find Faust's thought experiments far-fetched and of questionable evidential value. Consider:

Pond Barrier 2-hour (PB2H): I alone see a pond with an anonymous child playing around it. I know that this child will be drowning in the pond 2 hours from now. If I put $500 into the machine now it will put a barrier between the child and drowning just at the right time, preventing the child from drowning. I have to go to a meeting and can't hang around, so I need to make a decision now. (155, italics added).

Nevertheless, Faust claims that "The true test of the priority of preventing or treating harm" comes in the form of a comparison between this and another pond case:

I am walking between two ponds. In pond 1 is the Pond Hidden (PH) scenario, in which I will not witness the child's drowning or death, but will be told [and will believe] it is happening in real time [i.e., imminently]. In pond 2 is the Pond Barrier 2-Hour (PB2H) scenario, in which I will prevent [a child] from drowning 2 hours from now. My credit card is limited to $500 . . . Do I put my credit card into the machine at Pond 1 (PH) or Pond 2 (PB2H)? (156)

Faust comments:

Empirically most of us likely would put our money into the PH scenario even though PB2H would actually create more net well-being -- the child in PB2H would not experience any of the 'process of drowning' . . . The only conceivable reason to choose PH and not PB2H is because we know harm is happening right now, and this somehow moves us to act right now. (156, italics in original)

I agree that many people would choose Pond 1, and that this has to do with the fact that Pond 1 is unfolding now. But I suspect they will choose this option hoping that something else can be done for the child in Pond 2 before danger sets in. So they will not accept that more expected benefit comes from choosing the Pond 2 scenario first. In discussing a related example, Faust concedes that many people will "violate the thought experiment rules" by insisting "that our choices are rarely so limited in time" (167). Is there, then, a better thought experiment to test the hypothesis that compassion drives people to prioritize treatment over prevention? Suppose limited health funds force us to choose between (1) successfully treating an otherwise fatal case of AIDS today or (2) preventing two cases of HIV that will result in death from AIDS in 10 years.[3] This strikes me as a more useful example to reflect on (and one that may well be in tension with Faust's empirical hypothesis). It is also tragically realistic.[4]

The next essay in Part Two is "Treatment and Prevention: What Do We Owe Each Other?" by Norman Daniels. Daniels gives a brief overview of his influential theory of health justice, and then draws some lessons for the topic at hand. He also offers a new positive argument for a very weak form of priority of treatment over prevention. Daniels's account of health justice holds that "we have a robust social obligation to protect and promote health and that this obligation means we owe each other a reasonable array of both preventive and curative interventions" (176). Given limited resources and other pressing social concerns, this is not an obligation to provide all possible health-promoting assistance. Daniels has long been skeptical that there is one right way to allocate scarce resources, and he encourages citizens to engage one another in respectful deliberation to arrive at publicly legitimate (if not timelessly true) approaches to rationing. This is his general tack toward the prevention/treatment trade-off as well, although he stresses that socially disadvantaged groups should be granted special priority (especially for prevention) in light of the greater social and environmental risks they encounter.

Daniels's new positive argument for treatment's limited priority focuses on the fact that those in need of treatment are often "clearly worse off" than those who can benefit from prevention (189). Specifically, they are worse off in having much higher baseline risk. Suppose we have five tablets of medication and face six people. Cory will die if she doesn't receive all five tablets. Each of the other five individuals has a 20% risk of dying of the same disease; one tablet to each prevents the disease by eliminating this 20% risk. Daniels writes, "I believe we have a stronger obligation to treat Cory than to vaccinate the five others," even though "one expected life is saved in either case" (188). (I think Daniels wants us to stipulate for the sake of argument that one of the five others will die from the disease if the group isn't vaccinated.) He suggests that if one does not share his intuition in this case, at some point one will likely agree that the concentration of risk matters (e.g., if Cory needs the available 1,000 pills, which could instead be used to eliminate a 0.1% risk of dying in each of 1,000 others). Daniels isn't sure whether risk concentration is a reason to save one person at 100% risk of dying if we could instead save two lives by reducing already small baseline risks in a large group of people. "Risk concentration may matter in breaking ties but does not do more: this conclusion would need careful examination" (189).

I originally shared Daniels's intuition about cases in which only one life can be saved (the Cory vs. Others cases). But this is not my intuition in similar cases. Suppose the enemy has established two firing squads. Firing Squad 1 (FS1) has 1,000 marksmen pointing their guns at one innocent person tied to a post. Only one marksman has live bullets in his gun (the others have blanks). Firing Squad 2 (FS2) has 1 marksman with live bullets standing before 1,000 innocent people tied to numbered posts. If FS1 proceeds, all 1,000 marksmen will pull their triggers, and the innocent person will be killed by the marksman with live bullets. If FS2 proceeds, a random number generator will select a number between 1 and 1,000, and the lone marksman will then shoot and kill the innocent person tied to the post with that number. Suppose you know all this and you can stop one firing squad but not both. Is there a reason to stop one rather than the other? I believe not. But if not, then risk-concentration cannot even break ties in some cases. Is there a relevant difference between "Cory vs. Others" cases and the "FS1 vs. FS2" case? If there is not, then even the weak priority for treatment defended by Daniels is called into question.

Depending both on your baseline risk of death and on the size of the reduction you can achieve, you'll be willing to spend more or less money to reduce that risk. If you face near certain death, you might pay whatever you have (and can borrow) to reduce your risk considerably. If you face a 1 in 1,000,000 chance, you'll pay far less to eliminate it. In "The Variable Value of Life and Fairness to the Already Ill: Two Promising but Tenuous Arguments for Treatment's Priority," Menzel notes that economists often work with a notion of "the value of life" that is tied to individuals' willingness to pay for risk reductions. The more individuals are willing to pay to reduce a risk, the more value is accorded to saving a statistical life threatened by that risk. Menzel then asks whether treatment deserves priority over prevention since lives saved by treatment have more value in this economic sense. I agree with his answer: "The value of real life cannot be determined simply by values of risk reduction," as expressed by people's willingness to pay for them (208).

Instead of concluding, however, that this argument for treatment's priority is weak, Menzel concludes that in fact it supports a "weak form of priority" (211). He bases this surprising conclusion on the fact that individuals' willingness to pay conveys information about their preferences, which ought to be respected "in a society in which noncoerced choices are taken seriously" (209). Nevertheless, Menzel himself seems to believe that each death is equally worth avoiding, and that treatment and prevention should be chosen primarily on the basis of which prevents more deaths. Of course, if we choose prevention because it's more efficient, those who are sick now will neither be treated nor will they benefit much from the new focus on prevention. Menzel concedes that this is prima facie unfair to those who are currently ill, but he believes this unfairness can be morally outweighed by the larger number of lives saved through prevention. Moreover, "the unfairness to the already ill lasts only through the transition generation," after which those who get sick will still have benefited from a preventive reduction in overall population health risks (213). Does this mean we should never offer treatments today if instead we can prevent worse outcomes in the future? Menzel is clearly uncomfortable with that implication, and he later (in a different essay) suggests there are "reasons of fairness" for focusing on the "people all around us whose lives and health are at stake" (264). But he leaves it at that.

The next essay in Part Two is Thaddeus Pope's "The Slow Transition of U.S. Law toward a Greater Emphasis on Prevention." Pope gives an excellent overview of the development of public health law in America, highlighting the transition from a focus on communicable diseases to the current focus on unhealthy lifestyles and personal behaviors. He then explores whether the normative frameworks of communitarianism and liberalism can justify limiting individuals' liberty in order to prevent sickness and death. Pope worries that communitarianism "masks hard paternalism" by "restricting the liberty of a particular individual or group for the good of just that same individual or group" (236, italics added). However, the explicitly stated concern of public health communitarians is the overall "good of the community," not the good of the individuals it contains. Still, I think he is absolutely right that "more justification is needed before the mere invocation of 'community' justifies limiting liberty" (237). I wish only that Pope had ventured to offer a viable alternative to communitarianism. He expresses hope that "a new 'collective harm' liberty-limiting principle" can be added to classical liberalism, but this is not yet much different from the hope that a rights-respecting communitarianism can be salvaged. One theme highlighted by Pope's focus on lifestyle risks (but not explored by him) is that prevention is very often within people's own grasp. So one reason to prioritize treatment might be that prevention often helps those who can easily help themselves but who are too weak-willed or irresponsible to do so. Of course, this reason could only be used to prioritize treatments for individuals who are sick or disabled through no fault of their own.

An additional concern about standard cost-effectiveness analysis is that it discounts future benefits by 3% to 7% per year. In Part Two's final essay, "Should the Value of Future Health Benefits Be Time-Discounted?", Menzel expertly criticizes this practice, noting at the start that "At a 3.0% discount rate over 20 years . . . the present value of 10 years of future life drops to less than 6 years" (246). So an intervention that produces 10 QALYs today will be said to produce 4 more QALYs than an alternative intervention that produces 10 QALYs in 20 years. The practice of discounting therefore systematically disadvantages prevention relative to treatment. The debate over discounting usually pits economists (who tend to favor the practice) against philosophers (who tend to reject it). The philosopher's appraisal can seem almost self-evident when one learns that a 5% discount rate will treat one death today as equivalent to 1 billion deaths in 425 years (246, n. 1). It would be a mistake, however, to ignore economists' sometimes quite subtle (if invalid) arguments, especially since they have carried the day in real-world policy analysis. If one reads just one philosophical essay on this topic, it should be Parfit's "The Social Discount Rate" (which Menzel doesn't cite).[5] Menzel's should be next.

Prevention vs. Treatment is an exceptionally wide-ranging and provocative collection. It is valuable not only for its new contributions but also as an orienting guide to a wider literature. Political philosophy and health policy alike would be well served if there were more volumes like it.[6]

[1] An exception, to which I am indebted, is Daniel M. Hausman, "Qualms about Cost-Effectiveness" (unpublished manuscript). Hausman draws attention to the feature of CEA I go on to discuss, but he does not flag or explore its relevance for prevention vs. treatment, as he is focused on other issues.

[2] Rob Baltussen, et al., "Methods for Generalized Cost-Effectiveness Analysis" in T. Tan-Torres Edejer, et al. (eds.) WHO Guide to Cost-Effectiveness Analysis (Geneva: World Health Organization, 2003), p. 10.  One goal of this WHO Guide is to explain and defend an alternative to incremental CEA, which the WHO calls "generalized CEA."

[3] Jotkowitz and Glick pose a similar thought experiment in their contribution to Part Three (at 289).

[4] Dan W. Brock and Daniel Wikler, "Ethical Challenges in Long-Term Funding for HIV/AIDS: the Moral Imperative for Shifting Priorities from Treatment to Prevention,"Health Affairs 28(6) (2009): 1666-76.

[5] Derek Parfit, Reasons and Persons (New York: Oxford University Press, 1984), Appendix F.

[6] I wish to thank Bill Gardner and Brendan Saloner for very helpful comments on a previous draft of this review.