Price, Principle, and the Environment

Placeholder book cover

Sagoff, Mark, Price, Principle, and the Environment, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 284pp, $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 052154596x.

Reviewed by Daniel M. Hausman, University of Wisconsin, Madison


In Price, Principle, and the Environment, Mark Sagoff harshly condemns those sheep in wolves' clothing (22) who attempt to justify environmental protections on economic grounds. He maintains that the economic case for environmental protection is flimsy and incoherent, and that the conceptual framework of normative economics, concerned as it is with individual welfare, is antithetical to the moral and aesthetic values that motivate environmentalists.

I think that John Muir, in his polemic about Hetch Hetchy, suggested the right conceptual categories. He condemned those he called "temple destroyers" and "devotees of ravaging commercialism" and praised those who strove to protect the monuments of the Almighty. I understand these categories - the conflict between commerce and Creation. What I object to is the penchant of environmentalists to invoke the vocabulary of commerce - utility, benefit, instrumental value generally - to protect the works of Creation. (20)

In Sagoff's view, the solution to environmental problems does not lie in computing costs and benefits correctly so as to find efficient policies. It lies instead in deliberative political dialogue that is sensitive to the moral and aesthetic reasons supporting environmental protections as well as to the ramifications of those protections for economic growth and well-being.

As this summary makes clear, this is an ambitious book. To make his general case, Sagoff defends the following nine theses:

1. The most important reasons to protect landscape, species, waterways, marshes, and national monuments are moral and aesthetic, and to identify these reasons as subjective benefits to individuals is to misunderstand them completely. The reasons to control pollution are likewise to protect rights not to remedy inefficiencies.

2. Welfare economics takes welfare to be the satisfaction of preferences, but the satisfaction of preferences has no connection with well-being, and there is no justification for taking the satisfaction of preferences to be a social goal, let alone the paramount social goal.

3. Individual preferences cannot be observed or measured.

4. The price of something bears no relation at all to that thing's value to anyone. Prices measure exchange values rather than use values.

5. Attempts to determine how much people are willing to pay for something either measure its exchange value (and thus tell us nothing about use value) or are nothing but "a snare and a delusion" (100).

6. The concept of an externality is vacuous (111). State interventions to remedy market failures are either unnecessary or impractical (114). There is nothing the government can do to resolve a market failure that the private sector cannot do (110). To look to bureaucracies with scientific expertise to find the efficient solutions to environmental problems shows a naive and misplaced faith in science and in centralized control (202-5).

7. There is no danger of running of out resources, and the economic benefits of protecting the natural environment are small (chapter 7).

8. The solution to the conflicts between economic growth and environmental protection lies in case-by-case political compromise among local stake-holders. Economics has a role in designing institutions in which bargaining and compromise will be feasible.

9. Pollution abatement should be pursued to the point where the cost begins to increase rapidly - "to the knee of the curve" (53-4, 123).

I shall address my comments mainly to the first three theses, which are of more philosophical interest than the others, though I shall also say a bit about the last two theses and Sagoff's proposals for how environmental issues should be tackled.

Before turning to these matters, just a couple of words about the other theses and the overall character of the book. This is a polemical piece rather than a carefully qualified, sober, dull academic book. Sagoff is not an economist, and though his accounts of relevant work in economics are generally accurate, they are often confusing and exaggerated. Sagoff is a wonderful writer, and he is on a mission. Thus he sounds at times like a technological zealot, suggesting that there are no resource limits, no ecological dangers in economic growth, and no economic benefits in protecting natural environments from market forces, even though his argument requires only the weaker claim that the value of environmental protections cannot be cashed out in economic terms. He detests microeconomics and particularly welfare economics. He maintains that welfare economics is "impossible to test and ultimately even to understand" (70). Microeconomics is just as bad. It "has no data. As long as it has no data, it will perpetually flourish as a science" (73). He maintains that a preference, as understood by environmental economists "is itself an empty and useless theoretical term that cannot be observed or measured" (56). "[T]he massive research funding for improving CV [contingent valuation] methodology shows that the science of environmental economics has reached the apex of the postmodern; it results only in grant proposals, litigation, debates over methodology, and calls for further study" (74). "The fundamental choice, as always, lies between the institutions of a free society and pretensions of social science" (74-5).

The philosophical core of Price, Principle and the Environment lies in the Sagoff's critique of the assimilation of an individual's reasons for protecting the environment to welfare benefits to that individual, which economists then attempt to measure in the same way that they measure the benefits of private consumption. If Sagoff believes that it is a bad thing to cut down old growth forests, then he prefers that they not be cut down, though not of course because he believes that old growth forests will benefit him. Standard normative or welfare economics then works its alchemy and transmutes principle to personal profit by taking welfare to be the satisfaction of preferences. So, by definition, cutting down old growth forests makes Sagoff worse off. Since there are no markets for forest preservation, this "welfare" cost to Sagoff is not reflected in the cost of lumber extracted from old growth forests. By correcting this market failure and imputing a value to this benefit and also keeping careful track of the other benefits forests provide with respect to factors such as erosion, species preservation, and so forth, environmental economists try to show that cutting down these forests is a bad bargain in economic terms.

Sagoff regards this argument as a tissue of confusions from beginning to end. If one has already decided that principles and preferences reflect only individual benefits and that nothing matters except human welfare, then those who are concerned about the environment need to make the case that the welfare benefits of environmental protections exceed their costs. But, Sagoff argues, most of those who are concerned about the environment do not believe that nothing matters except their own welfare. They do not want to preserve forests or species because they believe that those forests or species make them better off. In seeking to preserve whales, for example, "We respond to moral and aesthetic judgments" rather than to expectations concerning the instrumental values whales may have in giving us pleasure or satisfying our needs (16-17). Environmentalists should make explicit that their concern for the environment rests on moral and aesthetic principles, not their personal interests. Permitting environmental economists to identify the moral and aesthetic reasons people have to protect the environment with private preferences and to measure the force of these reasons by the strength of people's feelings rather than the merits of people's arguments confuses and vitiates the case for protecting the environment. "[A] reliance on economic reasoning merely abandons at the start the very grounds that most validly justify efforts to protect nature from commercial and industrial exploitation" (155).

In Sagoff's view, the environmental economist's case thus collapses at its first step. But he wants to criticize all its other steps, too. As he maintains, welfare is not the satisfaction of preferences. We all know of cases where people were harmed by getting what they wanted. More ambitiously (and more dubiously), he denies that there is any correlation between welfare (as ordinarily understood) and preference satisfaction or any reason at all why permitting people's preferences to be better satisfied is morally desirable. Sagoff argues for these strong conclusions on the grounds that increasing wealth, which presumably enables people to satisfy their preferences better, does not contribute to happiness (unless one is impoverished) (48). I find this argument unconvincing, because self-reported happiness is a questionable indicator of well-being, and wealth is a questionable indicator of the extent to which people are able to satisfy their preferences. To take preference satisfaction as an indicator of welfare is certainly contestable, but it is not a silly view.

Sagoff also has a great deal to say about preferences, which he contends are unobservable and unmeasurable. Hence attempts to measure preferences by an individual's willingness to pay (whether this is revealed through market behavior or through contingent valuation studies) must fail. (Sagoff has additional and more specific criticisms of willingness to pay as a measure of benefit in chapter 4, which I shall not discuss here.) In arguing that preferences cannot be measured, Sagoff distinguishes, unhelpfully, in my opinion, between subjective, revealed, and formal notions of preference. I am dubious that there is a formal notion of preference, and as Sen and others have argued, the notion of a revealed preference is simply confused (Sen 1971, Hausman 2000). Preferences are an individual's subjective ranking of alternatives in terms of everything that matters to the individual. What Sagoff emphasizes - quite correctly - is that the alternatives among which an individual chooses are not easily observable. What is at issue in purchasing Girl Scout cookies (64-5) or in eating fish on Friday depends on how the chooser conceives of the alternatives - on what the alternatives mean to the chooser or preferer. This is a very important point. Failure to pay attention to it has undermined many attempts to elicit preferences. But I do not see why it implies that alternatives must be merely stipulated and that preferences are hence unmeasurable. Most economists concede that experiments demonstrate that people's preferences sometimes violate the axioms of rational choice theory. How could they have been driven to this concession, if preferences were unmeasurable?

Sagoff regards environmental economics along with its hugely expensive and inevitably inconclusive willingness-to-pay studies as essentially worthless (and he finds the work of preservationist "ecological" economists no better). The result with respect to forests has been a three-cornered tug of war, an "iron triangle", with the Forest Service at one vertex, various special interests at a second corner, and members of Congress intervening on behalf of their constituents at the third. "Any decision taken at one of these vertices will be appealed and probably blocked at another - and eventually dispute will wend its way through the judicial system, the fourth corner of this infamous triangle. The Iron Triangle as surely sinks public policy as the Bermuda Triangle sinks ships" (208-9). The whole edifice of cost-benefit studies is merely an occasion to pursue political aims under the banner of science. What we need instead is a return to politics. Those who want to preserve the environment need to make their arguments and to bargain with those whose welfare depends on activities that appropriate and transform nature. The way forward rests with bargains like those made by timber companies and environmentalists in Quincy, California (Chapter 9) or between the management of the Navajo Generating Station and environmentalists concerned about visibility at the Grand Canyon (187-93).

Democratic deliberation has many attractive features, and the anecdotes Sagoff recounts concerning its successes are impressive. But I've got some doubts. First, the outcomes of bargains depend crucially on the rules, the non-agreement point, who the parties are, and on their bargaining power. Industries will have an enormous advantage in bargaining power in localities where they are critical to employment and prosperity. Second, the logic of collective action applies just as stringently to the outcomes of local bargains as to individual choices in a prisoner's dilemma. What is best for all the parties in Quincy, California could be terrible for California or for the earth as a whole. Local bargaining is no substitute for environmental policy. Third, bargainers need some way to make trade-offs between profits, employment, and growth on the one hand, and the protection of a forest or a species on the other.

The institutional reforms that Sagoff favors, such as tradable emission rights and local bargaining, can surely help, but ultimately trade-offs must be made. How? Although Sagoff is absolutely right to protest against the assimilation of environmental values to welfare benefits, the methodology of measuring the benefits of preservation in terms of willingness to pay and then maximizing net benefits at least offers a rubric for making these tradeoffs. All that Sagoff has to offer in its place is the counsel that pollution abatement should be pursued up to the point where the costs of additional reductions in pollution start to increase much more rapidly - to the "knee of the curve." But not all cost curves have knees and many have more than one. Depending on the importance of what is at stake, it may be sensible to stop offering further protection well before the knee or to pay for protection well beyond the knee. Moving beyond pollution, Sagoff has nothing to say about how much people should be willing to pay to protect nature. Granted that the decisions should be made democratically and deliberately, it would nevertheless be nice to know something about what principles should govern decisions concerning tradeoffs.

Price, Principle, and the Environment is provocative and wide-ranging. It points to serious misunderstandings of the value of the environment on the part of economists and to serious and unresolved questions concerning how to respect and to trade off environmental values.


Hausman, Daniel. 2000. "Revealed Preference, Belief, and Game Theory." Economics and Philosophy 16: 99-115.

Sen, Amartya. 1971. "Choice Functions and Revealed Preference." Review of Economic Studies, 38: 307-17.