Primitive Colors: A Case Study in Neo-pragmatist Metaphysics and Philosophy of Perception

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Joshua Gert, Primitive Colors: A Case Study in Neo-pragmatist Metaphysics and Philosophy of Perception, Oxford University Press, 2017, 237 pp., $60.00, ISBN 9780198785910.


Reviewed by Pär Sundström, Umeå University


Some think colours are properties of cucumbers and tomatoes. Others that they are properties of sense-data or visual experiences. Yet others think that colours are like the property of ruling by divine right: they are properties nothing has despite some beliefs to the contrary.

One thing that nearly everyone agrees on in this debate is that something has a determinable colour, like red, blue or green, if and only if it has a determinate colour, i.e., a specific shade of red, blue and green. A centre-piece of this book is a rejection of that agreement. According to Gert, determinable colours, which he prefers to call "rough colours" or "objective colours", are properties of objects in our environment like cucumbers. By contrast, determinate colours, which Gert prefers to call "precise colours" or "colour appearances", are "ways" of experiencing cucumbers and tomatoes, and this kind of property is "best thought of adverbially; it is a property of a visual experience thought of as an event" (88).

Another centre-piece of the book -- reflected in its title -- is an argument that "objective colours" are primitive in that they cannot be reduced to "such things as sets of spectral reflectances, disjunctions of microphysical surface properties, or dispositions to cause experiences" (218). (The book is silent on the reducibility or irreducibility of "precise colours".)

Besides this separation of objective colours and colour appearances, Gert argues that colour terms, like 'red' and 'blue' are "in a certain sense ambiguous and can have two quite different kinds of referent" (88), the two referents being objective colours and colour appearances, respectively.

The book also develops a view about colour perception; in particular, about constancy in colour perception. Gert suggests that colour perception is importantly analogous with three-dimensional shape perception. When one views a cube from different perspectives, one is perceptually aware both of things that vary with one's perspectives, and of something that remains constant between them. What is constant is the three-dimensional shape of the object. What varies are appearances of the shape. Similarly, when one views a wrinkled, uniformly pink T-shirt, one is perceptually aware both of the uniform pinkness, which is an objective colour of the T-shirt, and of perspective-dependent "appearances" of that objective colour.

Objective colours are in this way "associated with functions from viewing circumstances to color appearances" (111). But objective colours are not identical with such functions. Like three-dimensional shapes, they are instead "categorical properties", which objects have independently of viewing circumstances, and that are the bases of functions from viewing circumstances to appearances (104, 138-9).

These views about colours, colour terms, and colour perception are developed and defended in part on the basis of what Gert calls "neo-pragmatism". One characterisation of this approach, which is inspired primarily by Huw Price, says that it "avoids making substantive use of semantic notions -- truth and reference, for example -- and begins by viewing human linguistic activity as a naturalistically unmysterious production of structured sounds and marks" (47). Another characterisation says that, "The focus of neo-pragmatism is explicitly linguistic. That is, its goal is to explain how and why we talk the way we do" (225). I will not dig deep into how this should be understood, but we will see shadows of Gert's neo-pragmatism in what follows.

In the remainder, I will take some closer and partly critical looks at, in turn, Gert's "adverbialism" about "precise colours", and his "primitivist realism" about "objective colours". The latter part will touch on the proposed analogy between colour perception and three-dimensional shape perception.

Gert's adverbialism about precise colours is motivated by intersubjective variability in experiences of them. If two perceivers look at a colour chip in the same lighting conditions, one might experience unique green -- green that has no yellow or blue in it -- while the other experiences slightly bluish green. Such variations exist among perceivers that are equally normal by any test we have or can envisage.

One view of this situation is that:

(1a) The colour chip has exactly one precise colour, and (1b) it is therefore possible that one perceiver has an accurate precise colour experience, but it is not possible that both do.

The (a)-part of this is a claim about the colour chip; the (b)-part is about us and our experiences; similarly below.

Gert calls the conjunction of (1a) and (1b) "heroic realism". It contrasts with his own realism, which is more "realistic". Heroic realism is defended by Tye (2006), Byrne and Hilbert (2007), and Allen (2016).

A different, "pluralist" view of the present situation is that:

(2a) The colour chip has many precise colours, and (2b) it is therefore possible that both perceivers have accurate precise colour experiences.

One version of pluralism says that colours are relational properties, which are aptly characterised by phrases such as 'is unique green for such-and-such perceiver in such-and-such viewing circumstance'. Cohen (2009) defends such a view. McGinn (1996) and Kalderon (2007) defend non-relational versions of pluralism.

A third, "eliminativist" view is that:

(3a) The colour chip has no precise colour, and (3b) both perceivers therefore have inaccurate precise colour experiences.

Gert accepts (3a). Does he also accept (3b)? I do not find a clear answer in the book. On the one hand, Gert claims that "in disputes regarding the precise colors of objects, everyone is wrong" (93, see also 101, 120). This suggests acceptance of (3b), since it is natural to suppose that, if everyone is wrong that is because everyone is misled by inaccurate precise colour experiences.

But on the other hand, Gert claims that, when you see something as unique green and I see it as bluish green, "neither of us can plausibly be regarded as misrepresenting the color of anything" (193). And he regards it as an advantage of his adverbialism that it avoids imputing error to "normal" perceivers (145).

However this may be, Gert clearly accepts (3a). In fact, he makes the stronger claim that no physical object "even could have" a precise colour (70). The supposition that a physical object has a precise colours is, he suggests, "just as problematic as the assertion that the true length of the coastline is 7,391,422 feet" (69).

These claims are supposed to somehow be supported by our "ineliminable disagreement" (113) about the precise colours of objects. But how exactly does this disagreement, which is a fact about us, support the conclusion that things like cucumbers lack precise colours, and necessarily so?

I find two thoughts in the text. One is that (a) "it would be arbitrary to select one of the parties as having latched onto the truth of the matter at the expense of the other" (93). The other is (b) that there is "no plausible explanation of what could make it true that there was, nevertheless, some fact of the matter that was eluding us" (113). I do not see that either thought provides good support for the claim that cucumbers do not and "could" not have precise colours.

Regarding (b), it is natural to take precise colours to be properties that things can have. And Gert issues no reason to doubt that. Indeed, he thinks some things, namely visual experiences, have precise colours. Now here is a proposal: What would make it true that a cucumber has a precise colour is that the cucumber has that kind of property. I do not see why that is not a satisfactory "explanation of what could make it true" that a cucumber has a precise colour.

Regarding (a), it would no doubt be "arbitrary" of us to select one perceiver rather than another as getting things right when it comes to which precise colour a given cucumber has. But I cannot see that that by itself is a strong reason to accept Gert's view, especially given that it seems clear enough what would make it true that a cucumber has a certain precise colour. Gert insists that he has no commitment to "verificationism", (205) but unless something of that kind is assumed, I cannot see how the present line of thought can justify its conclusion.

It is worth reflecting here on how things would stand if perceivers were different. Gert maintains that if there were "unanimous agreement" among "normal" perceivers about the precise colours of cucumbers, then "a persuasive case could be made" that cucumbers have precise colours (71). (That is also the kind of argument that Gert makes for realism about "rough" colours, more on which below). This is noteworthy because there are scenarios concerning this that we cannot rule out with certainty, or even confidently.

Suppose there are aliens out there that live in coloured environments much like ours and that perceive and talk about "rough" colours much as we do. If there are, we could presumably translate their colour words into ours just as well as we can currently translate colour terms between languages on earth. Suppose the aliens also have words that they learn and explain the way that we learn and explain 'unique green' and the like, namely -- as Gert plausibly suggests (79-80, 109) -- with the help of phrases like 'a shade that is green and has no blue or yellow in it'. I believe Gert and everyone else ought to agree that the aliens then have phrases that mean what 'unique green' means. How unlikely is the existence of such aliens? I believe nobody knows. One might think it is unlikely since there is presumably a dizzying number of possible colour perceivers. But on the other hand, there is for all we know a dizzying number of alien perceivers out there. If there are, chances are that many possible colour perceivers are realised in multiple populations.

Now, if there are such perceivers, it is, I presume, anybody's guess whether they agree or disagree among themselves about the precise colours of environmental objects and whether they would agree with some of us if they saw our cucumbers. Suppose there are such perceivers and that they all agree among one another and would agree with some among us about what is unique green. Suppose, indeed, there are several distinct populations of such perceivers. I suspect Gert is committed to accepting that, if this is the case, then there is -- objectively speaking as it were -- a "persuasive case" that cucumbers have precise colours. Because there then seems to be a case for saying that some among us are aberrations, and that there is "unanimous agreement" among all the "normals". But if we cannot rule this out with certainty -- or even very confidently -- it seems that Gert's present conclusions must be overstated. If for all we know -- or know with certainty -- there is in fact a "persuasive case" that cucumbers have precise colours, then this hypothesis must make sense in a way that assertions about the exact lengths of coastlines do not.

While "ineliminable disagreement" about precise colours motivates Gert's "adverbialism" about these, he takes our "overwhelming agreement" (65) about the rough colours of things, together with our practise of correcting diverging applications, to guarantee that cucumbers and tomatoes have such colours. The practise of correcting one another distinguishes colour talk from talk about, say, pleasure and pain. We do not regard someone as mistaken if she, against consensus, applies 'pleasant' to faculty meetings. But we do regard someone as mistaken if she, against consensus, applies 'red' to a ripe cucumber. The principle that an overwhelming agreement ensures correctness is reliable only for the latter kind of case (65-6).

One might have expected that, given this line of defence for realism, Gert would be noncommittal about the nature of rough colours. It is likely not an accident that tomatoes and strawberries give rise to similar colour experiences in us. If this is not an accident, it is plausible that tomatoes and strawberries share some property that explains the relevant experiences. And therefore, if being right in our applications of 'red' to tomatoes and strawberries requires nothing more than that -- that they share some such property -- then it may be plausible that we are practically guaranteed to be right in these applications (compare Chalmers 2005). If on the other hand being right in our applications of 'red' to tomatoes and strawberries requires that they have some property that meets some further condition -- having some qualitative nature for example -- then it is harder to see how we can be guaranteed to be right. For we could easily be right to think that tomatoes and strawberries have some property that explains the relevant experiences but wrong to think that this property meets the further condition. Another reason to expect a noncommittal view about the natures of rough colours from Gert is that he says that his interest in colour realism concerns language; in particular, it concerns such questions as: "Is the sentence 'This apple is green' ever literally true?" (75).

However, Gert is very committal about the nature of rough colours. He takes an account of the nature of rough colours to be constrained by the principle:

  • Modest Revelation: A complete understanding of what dark blue is can be given by showing someone something that is dark blue, if that person has normal vision and has already acquired color concepts (23).

Modest Revelation belongs to a family of principles that have been much discussed in the philosophy of colour since Johnston (1992). The "modest" aspect of Gert's principle lies in its restriction to persons that have already acquired colour concepts. But even with this restriction, Modest Revelation is -- despite its name -- a strong and dialectically very powerful principle. For example, it is relatively easy to defend, as Gert does, nonreductionism about colour given Modest Revelation. That is because it seems plausible that, in the intended senses:

(i) If there is some property P such that dark blue reduces to P, then P is what dark blue is.

(ii) For any property P that is a candidate reduction base for dark blue, it is not the case that an understanding that P is what dark blue is can be given by showing someone something that is dark blue, even if that person has normal vision and has already acquired colour concepts.

Consider for example a certain "reflectance profile" (the kind of thing that is specified by stating what percentage of incident light on a surface is reflected for each wavelength in the visible spectrum). Call it RP. It is plausible that, if dark blue reduces to RP, then RP is what dark blue is. But it is not the case that a complete understanding that RP is what dark blue is can be, in the intended sense, "given" by showing someone something that is dark blue. Assuming this and Modest Revelation, we can infer that dark blue does not reduce to RP. Similarly, it would seem, for every candidate reduction base for every rough colour.

Why should we accept this powerful principle, Modest Revelation? Gert argues that "the concepts we have are shaped by our practical interests", and our practical interests in colour are restricted to their appearances. This distinguishes our colour concepts from our concepts of, say, shapes and water, where our interests are not thus restricted (21). I think this is at least part of what Gert has in mind when he claims that Modest Revelation "falls out of a certain use-theoretic account of meaning and understanding" (24).

I am somewhat sympathetic with revelation-based arguments for nonreductionism about colour (compare Sundström 2007, sect. 3). However, for reasons already indicated, I am sceptical of combining (a) Modest Revelation and colour nonreductionism with (b) an agreement based argument for colour realism. If we understand red to be something that satisfies Modest Revelation and is therefore plausibly irreducible to "such things as sets of spectral reflectances, disjunctions of microphysical surface properties, or dispositions to cause experiences", then I cannot see how we can be assured, on the basis of our responses to them, that tomatoes are red. I cannot see how we could learn that much about tomatoes from the relevant facts about us.

Modest Revelation is arguably also in tension with Gert's radical separation of rough colours and precise colours. If cucumbers are green but no cucumber has a precise shade of green, one might wonder what is it for something to be green. Whatever it is, one might worry that it is something "noumenal" that is hidden "behind" the precise colours and that we can reason our way to but not directly experience (Brown 2014, 26, issues a similar concern about Gert's view). That would not sit well with Moderate Revelation.

Gert's response to this worry connects with his view of colour constancy. He proposes that rough colours are "present to experience in the same way that three-dimensional shapes are" (184). I am again somewhat sympathetic with the idea of understanding colours and colour perception on the model of shapes and shape perception (compare Sundström 2013). However, Gert's separation of rough and precise colours limits the ways he can develop this analogy, and the limitations matter for the present "noumenality" concern.

Let us first consider the shape case. What exactly are the appearances of three-dimensional shapes that we are presented with in experience, and in what way can three-dimensional shapes be present in experience in addition to these appearances? Gert does not go into details here, but the following is, I think, a natural proposal. The appearances are constitutive aspects of the three-dimensional shapes. For example, when one views a cube from a certain close-up perspective, a two-dimensional square is present in one's experience. This square is a constitutive aspect of the cubeness; to be cubical is, in part, to have a square side. From other perspectives, what is present in experience when one views a cube are various "2.5 dimensional" appearances, which are also constitutive aspects of the cubeness. And the three-dimensional shapes are present in experience in the way that things are present in experience when some of their constitutive aspects are.

Now, although Gert sometimes says that colour appearances are "aspects" of objective colours (96, 110, 220), an account of the colour case that parallels the above is not available to him, as far as I can see. That is because the following principle seems right:

The Constitutive Aspect Principle: For all x, y, and z: If x is a property, and y a constitutive aspect of x, and x is instantiated by z, then y is instantiated by z.

If, as Gert maintains, colour appearances and objective colours are properties of different things, it follows from this principle that one cannot be a constitutive aspect of the other. And then it cannot be the case that objective colours are present in experience in that colour appearances, which are constitutive aspects of objective colours, are present in experience. Given his separation of the two, it is arguably more natural to regard colour appearances as "mental veils" standing in between perceivers and the objective colours of cucumbers.

There is a partly related dilemma arising from Gert's separation of rough and precise colours. His view entails that something can be red without being any precise shade of red. He defends this implication by pointing out that someone can be, for example, bald without being bald to any precise degree (109-110). But how about the converse? It seems plausible that if something is some precise shade of red then it is red. If so, and if visual experiences have precise colours, then they also have rough colours. Now, are these rough colours the same rough colours that cucumbers have? Either answer seems unattractive. Suppose they are the same. Then it is really odd that rough colours as instantiated by experiences all come in precise shades while no rough colour instantiated by a cucumber does. Suppose they are different. Suppose, that is, that the rough colours of cucumbers are not determinables of the determinate shades of colour that we experience. That would again fuel a noumenality concern about the rough colours of cucumbers.

I have focused on some questions and concerns about Gert's most central theses. But the book is rich in interesting ideas and other valuable material. Besides things I have discussed or mentioned above, the introduction includes excellent overviews both of basic colour science and of the connections between the philosophy of colour and other philosophical issues. The argumentative parts include a "disunified approach" to intrapersonal, interpersonal, and interspecies perceptual variations, reviews of some important scientific results bearing on colour constancy, a public language based criticism of certain inversion scenarios, a critique of "transparency" based arguments about colour, and a defence of the "conceptualist" view that there is nothing in our conscious visual experiences that goes beyond our conceptual capacities. All of its discussions are engaging and deserve serious consideration.


Thanks to Derek Brown and Joshua Gert for helpful discussions about an earlier draft.


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