Principled Ethics: Generalism as a Regulative Ideal

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Sean McKeever and Michael Ridge, Principled Ethics: Generalism as a Regulative Ideal, Oxford University Press, 2006, 252pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0199290660.

Reviewed by Daniel Star, Australian National University


Principled Ethics is an excellent work of philosophy. Its authors, Sean McKeever and Michael Ridge, are to be congratulated for carefully identifying and untangling the various strands of moral particularism to be found in the literature (often knotted together in a philosophically counterproductive manner), for submitting the strands that they judge to be the most important to rigorous criticism, and for developing a rich and interesting account of generalism in the process -- an account of generalism that they name "generalism as a regulative ideal". (For those unfamiliar with the literature: generalists are supporters of moral principles, while particularists reject moral principles at the same time as remaining realists about the intentional objects of context-specific moral judgements, e.g. normative reasons, oughts, etc.)

No philosopher working on particularism should ignore McKeever and Ridge's arguments. Something that might be less obvious, but still true, is that it would be a great shame if this book were ignored by ethicists who are not in the least attracted to particularism and might therefore feel they need not read a book primarily aimed at convincing its readers that particularism is wrong-headed. In fact, for all of us doing ethics there is much to be learnt from the account of generalism that is developed and defended in the book, as well as from the challenges and lessons the authors recognize and accept from the particularists in the course of developing their wide-ranging critique. It is a great strength of the book that its authors are very open to learning from their opponents. They are also attentive and charitable in their interpretations and reconstructions of particularist claims and arguments, which naturally makes their critique all the more powerful.

The following commentary attempts to provide a bare sketch of the book, along with critical reflections at a few important junctures. Unfortunately, there is no room to discuss a large number of the authors' very interesting arguments. The book is divided into nine chapters and an appendix (the latter provides a discussion of Richard Holton's 'That's It' principles and how they differ from the authors' 'default principles', which are themselves the subject of Chapter 6). The book begins with a chapter, aptly titled "The Many Moral Particularisms", dedicated to distinguishing between different particularist claims. The five types of particularism that the authors identify here and argue against in later chapters are: (1) Principle Eliminativism ("There are no true moral principles"); (2) Principle Skepticism Particularism ("There is no good reason to think there are any true moral principles"); (3) Principled Particularism ("Any finite set of moral principles will be insufficient to capture all moral truths"); (4) Principle Abstinence Particularism ("We ought not rely on moral principles"); and (5) Anti-Transcendental Particularism ("The possibility of moral thought and judgment do not depend on the provision of a suitable supply of moral principles."). The authors reject all five particularisms, and accept five corresponding generalisms.

An additional claim that some might choose to label particularist but that many, including the authors, are only too happy to accept as both true and compatible with a sensible generalism is that there are no moral principles that function as algorithmic decisions procedures, i.e. procedures that can be applied mechanically to output correct moral judgments. The authors think that it is sensible to suppose that there will always be an important role for non-mechanical judgment to play in our moral thinking (p. 11). This can seem plausible as long as we assume, as the authors seem to, that (1) we are talking about judgments made across all cases, and that (2) the judgments are being made by ordinary human agents (or creatures with similar psychological constitutions), rather than enormously powerful computers that have some way to survey all the facts that constitute the supervenience base for moral facts, then use moral principles (supplied by wise human programmers, we might imagine) to spit out moral judgments. The second assumption is clearly legitimate because of the obvious gulf separating human beings and the imagined computers.

The first assumption is more problematic, because a principle-based algorithm might work in a reasonably large number of cases and be worth following for that reason, perhaps as long as the agent is open to the possibility that he may need to cease using the algorithm on some occasions. An example of a relevant kind of algorithm would be: (a) check how one feels about the options being considered; (b) ask oneself if one's feeling is at least partly based on a consideration that is morally irrelevant; (c) if the answer to the last question is "yes", try to stop attending to this consideration and go back to (a); (d) run through the list of seemingly salient features of the situation to make sure one has left nothing out; (e) if a previously unnoticed feature now becomes salient, go back to (a); (f) recall from memory moral principles that one has previously followed that feature these salient features …  etc. Perhaps agents already follow algorithms that have something like this kind of content and structure, or perhaps they would sometimes act in a much better way than they actually do behave if they were to follow such algorithms. The authors might reply at this point that all they meant to rule out was an unquestioning or inflexible adherence to algorithms. The problem with this response would be that with respect to the kinds of generalism that they support, they deny that accepting generalism involves being unquestioning or inflexible in one's commitment to particular principles, so it is unclear why this type of generalism needs to be defined so as to rule out flexibility and open-endedness (it is only because it is so defined that it looks like "an extremely strong form of generalism", p. 92). In addition, one of the main types of principle that they favour, 'default principles', are hedged principles (Chapter 6), and one might well wonder why we should rule out hedged algorithms (with 'exit' clauses built in, as it were).

There also seems to be a tension between the authors' complete rejection of generalism about algorithmic principles for human agents and their opposition to an important particularist claim, first discussed in Chapter 1, but argued against at more length later in Chapter 7. This is Jonathan Dancy's claim that, to the extent that one is virtuous, "there is nothing that one brings to the new situation other than a contentless ability to discern what matters where it matters." (quoted on p. 18, my italics). In the relevant passage (more of which is quoted in the book), Dancy is proffering this 'contentless ability' as an alternative to an ability to be guided by principles, and the authors put together a good case (in Chapters 7 and 9) for thinking that a faculty of judgement unaided by principles would be very much inferior to one guided by principles. The problem is that they also quite rightly think that agents should be open to revising principles in the light of new considerations. This leads one to wonder whether the ability to revise principles is a contentless ability or is itself guided by principles. If a contentless ability is suspicious on the level of forming judgments about what one has reason to do, why is it not suspicious on the level of forming judgments about whether or not one has reason to revise one's principles (or beliefs about what considerations count as reasons)? Assuming that the correct response to this question is to claim that the ability to form judgments about whether or not one has reason to revise one's principles is itself essentially an ability guided by higher-level principles, it is very tempting to think of these higher-level principles as forming algorithms (although, admittedly, this is not strictly required).

Having jumped ahead to later chapters in this discussion, we should return to Chapter 2, "Holism about Reasons". Holism about reasons is the theory that "a reason in one case may be no reason at all, or an opposite reason, in another" (this is Dancy's definition, which the authors endorse on p. 27). Holists are opposed to atomism about reasons, which is the thesis that "a feature that is a reason in one case must remain a reason, and retain the same polarity, in another" (Dancy again, quoted on p. 27). The authors argue against the claim (to be found in Dancy's work) that there is a deep connection between holism about reasons and particularism, such that supporting holism about reasons more or less amounts to supporting the view that there are no true principles (of a manageable length). The authors are very sympathetic to holism about reasons (they often refer to enablers, which they take to be a central element of the holist picture, in the course of developing their own account of generalism). They argue that it is simply wrong to think of a commitment to holism about reasons as requiring a commitment to particularism. Their argument turns on accepting that the following theory (which they offer merely as an example to make their point, and not because they wish to endorse its specific content) is principle-based, yet also holistic:

(U) The fact that an action would promote pleasure is a reason to perform the action if and only if the pleasure is nonsadistic. The fact that an action would promote pain is a reason not to perform the action. An action is morally right just in case it promotes at least as great a balance of reason-giving pleasures over pain as any of the available alternatives; otherwise it is wrong. (p. 29)

It is not clear that this argument achieves all that the authors think it does. To see why the argument might be considered a little quick, compare U with a clearly atomistic alternative:

(Ua) The fact that an action would promote nonsadistic pleasure is a reason to perform the action. The fact that an action would promote pain is a reason not to perform the action. An action is morally right just in case it promotes at least as great a balance of reason-giving pleasures over pain as any of the available alternatives; otherwise it is wrong.

Now we might ask: Is (U) best thought of as a genuinely holistic theory, given the fact that it can so easily be transformed into (Ua)? (and this type of transformation seems to always be available for any complete principle-based theory of a manageable size). The two theories are extensionally equivalent with respect to what they have to say about the moral rightness and wrongness of acts, and with respect to which pleasures and pains are reason-giving. The only difference is that one theory claims pleasures are reasons, but only when enabled by the absence of sadism, and the other theory claims that nonsadistic pleasures are reasons. The authors seem to implicitly acknowledge that there is an almost identical atomistic theory in the neighbourhood when they say, "According to (U) …  it is the fact that an action would promote pleasure that is a reason when it is a reason and not the fact that it would promote nonsadistic pleasure. So (U) presupposes holism about reasons." (p. 29)

Imagine being convinced that one of (U) and (Ua) was a correct moral theory, before one had come across the other theory, and then imagine being shown the other theory. It is very difficult to imagine on what basis one would decide that (U) is correct and (Ua) incorrect, or vice versa. This seems to provide a strong reason for doubting that (U) is holistic in any very interesting sense, since (Ua) is undoubtedly atomistic. In the light of this conclusion, the particularist may be well-placed to offer an alternative account of holism. Perhaps Dancy's original definition of reasons holism is incomplete. A good candidate for an additional requirement for holism about reasons is that it be accepted that there is no end to the number of features that might count as a reason or an enabler (not that all features must be able to count as a reason or an enabler in some context, just that an indefinitely or unmanageably large number might). If this were so, then no theory with a structure that is like (U) could ever be stated, or be susceptible to being transformed into a theory with a structure that is like (Ua) (or, if we imagine that such a transformation would always still be available from a gods-eye view, the choice of the original theory over the transformed theory might be justified on some principled basis, such as that a much larger part of it is epistemically available to ordinary agents). The authors argue against the claim that there might be a very large or infinite number of features that might count as reasons later in the book (in Chapters 6 and 7), so this alternative way of defining holism would by no means leave them in a position where they have no arguments against such a holist particularism, but it would prevent them from disentangling holism and particularism quite so straightforwardly. This would not worry those of us who are generalists with atomistic sympathies (about which more below).

To avoid confusion, let us return to using the definition of "holism" that the authors themselves use, despite the concern just raised. In Chapter 3 ("Default Reasons"), the authors claim that

on any plausible version of holism all reasons require enablers …  [because] certain considerations need always to be present for any consideration to count as a reason but are not themselves part of the reason which they make possible. The best example of this is that no fact can be a reason for an agent to perform an action if the agent cannot perform the action … the fact that an agent could do something is not part of the reason to do it. (p. 49)

It seems to follow from what the authors say here that the following theory counts as holistic:

(Ue) The fact that an action would promote pleasure is a reason to perform an action if and only if the action can be performed. The fact that an action would promote pain is a reason not to perform an action if and only if the action can be refrained from being performed. An action is morally right just in case it promotes at least as great a balance of pleasures over pain as any of the available alternatives; otherwise it is wrong.

However, to describe (Ue) as an holistic theory seems patently absurd, for all theories that accept a "reasons imply can" principle would be holistic theories on this approach. Fortunately, the authors themselves provide the resources by which we might ensure that such theories are ruled out through adjusting the definition of holism (although they do not see that they have put themselves in a position where it might be a good idea to adjust the definition). They provide a very useful distinction between global enablers and local enablers, defining the first as "a consideration that must obtain before there can be any reason for an agent to perform an action" (p. 50). A local enabler is just a consideration that is not a global enabler but that nonetheless must obtain in order for some considerations to count as reasons. Now, the definition of holism might be adjusted so as to contain a clause specifying that a theory will only be holistic if there is at least one local enabler according to the theory. (U) is an example of a theory that has one local enabler, so (U) would be a holistic theory (if this were the only adjustment made to Dancy's original definition of holism).

The authors conclude Chapter 2 by arguing that while a commitment to holism does not require or entail a commitment to particularism, particularism might very plausibly be thought to entail holism. This means that particularists are vulnerable to attack in a way that generalists are not, since it follows that arguments for atomism about reasons (or against holism about reasons) are also effectively arguments against particularism (although the authors go on to paint a picture of generalism that involves holistic elements, they indicate at this point that they would not be too upset if they needed to give these up). The fact that the authors are not concerned to argue for atomism or against holism, in combination with their own argument that particularism entails holism, implies that there is at least one very important type of anti-particularist argument that their book does not concern itself with (all of their other arguments against particularism would be unnecessary if someone were able to present a knock-down argument against holism, but, of course, knock-down arguments are few and far between in philosophy).

The aim of Chapter 3 is to overturn the particularist view that some reasons are "default reasons", i.e. reasons that have a context-independent default status (either for or against action). Particularists need to be able to rely on some such notion if they are to avoid promoting a picture of reasons that threatens to "flatten the normative landscape" (p. 47) by implausibly implying that shoelace color is on a par with killing in terms of relevance to morality in general. The authors consider three different ways of attempting to provide a robust account of default reasons (two of them come from Dancy's work, and the remaining account is from a couple of very interesting papers by Mark Lance and Margaret Little), and provide good arguments against all of them.

Chapter 4 ("Moral Vision") attacks the use of a perceptual model of moral judgment to defend particularism. The authors contend that this perceptual model is compatible with the forms of generalism that they wish to defend (they claim it is even compatible with the algorithmic generalism that they reject). They carefully examine the analogy with chess that might at first be thought to help particularists (perhaps expert chess players go beyond rules governing moves and just 'see' which moves to make, much as a virtuous agent might be thought to transcend the moral rules taught to children), and provide good reasons for thinking that even expert chess players follow (sophisticated) rules. The conclusion, that appeals to perceptual phenomenology, in either the domain of chess or the domain of morality, will not help the particularist, seems warranted.

Chapter 5 ("Constitutive Generalism") is concerned with a generalist response to the particularist that the authors reject. This is the response that Frank Jackson, Philip Pettit, and Michael Smith provided several years ago. This chapter provides an important contribution to metaethics, on the side of those who believe that there is considerable force behind Moore's Open Question argument. The authors argue quite reasonably and forcefully that analysis of our moral concepts cannot settle the particularism debate, thus closing off a generalist short-cut. Readers outside of ethics with an interest in the philosophy of concepts and the Canberra Program should also find this chapter useful.

From Chapter 6 onwards, the book changes course (it is, in fact, formally divided into two parts), as the authors develop their own positive account of generalism, while continuing to argue against opposing particularist claims. Chapter 6 ("From Moral Knowledge to Default Principles") and Chapter 7 ("Beyond Default Principles: Trimming the Hedges") are the most important chapters of the book, at least insofar as the attack on particularism is concerned. Unfortunately, this review will not be able to do them justice. Suffice it to say that the authors' strategy here is to begin with an assumption that they share with particularists and that is independently highly plausible, i.e. that moral knowledge is possible, then build up hedged principles from context-specific judgments that the particularist shares, before arguing that there are a finite number of reasons, and that the hedges can be removed. An example of the kind of hedged principle they have in mind is:

(P) For all actions (x) and all facts (F): If F is a fact to the effect that x would be pleasant and no other feature of the situation explains why F is not a reason to x, then F is a reason to x. (p. 120)

Chapter 8 ("Generalism as a Regulative Ideal") provides an account of what makes a commitment to the practice of articulating moral principles valuable and Chapter 9 ("Principled Guidance") provides a complementary account of why it is valuable to follow moral principles. The value of articulating principles is explained in terms of the effect it has on moral progress, as well as the effect it has on moral philosophical reflection and then the trickle-down effects that might be produced as a result of this reflection. The value of following principles is explained in terms of their tendency to work against special pleading on the part of individuals and the way in which they might be used to correct certain framing effects due to our imperfect psychology.

A particularly interesting challenge to the authors' view that only a limited number of considerations can ever be reasons is raised in the second half of Chapter 6. This challenge rests on making a distinction between 'primary reasons' and 'secondary reasons' (the distinction has previously been put to work in an interesting paper by David McNaughton and Piers Rawling that the authors refer to), where primary reasons are reasons in all contexts, and secondary reasons are reasons that are in some way parasitic on primary reasons. It might be thought that holism holds on the level of primary reasons and that any consideration at all can be a secondary reason. The authors note that this distinction may be particularly useful for atomists, who can view all primary reasons as atomistic while accepting that secondary reasons are holistic, but they focus on a "holism-friendly" way of using the distinction (p. 131). Nonetheless, their arguments for the non-existence of secondary reasons apply to atomists as well, and this is important because it may be the case that employing a strategy of distinguishing between primary and secondary reasons is the best (or only) way of establishing the truth of atomism, and thus the falsity of particularism (by an alternative route to the one the authors favour; recall that they accept that particularism entails holism).

There are two main arguments supplied in the book for the view that there are no secondary reasons (pp. 132-33), and fortunately they are fairly easy to relay. The first is that it seems counterintuitive to suppose that the world is as heavily populated with reasons as secondary reason supporters would normally contend. To use the authors' example: if I promise to buy someone a plaid cap, it seems odd to say that the promise generates two reasons, i.e. a reason to fulfill a promise (by buying a plaid cap), and a reason to buy a plaid cap. This argument seems to have limited force. It is not clear that the existence of a plenitude of reasons (generated in ways that remain to be fully specified) is counterintuitive, but even if it is, it might not provide a particularly bitter pill to swallow.

The second argument is that the normative force of a secondary reason adds nothing to the normative force of the relevant primary reason, but considerations that add no normative force hardly deserve to be called reasons:

For now a so-called secondary reason is a reason which does not itself speak in favour of the action for which it is supposed to be a reason. We seem to be stuck with the idea of a reason with zero weight, but that sounds to us like no reason at all. (p.133)

Arguably, the authors have overlooked a very important possibility at this point. Let us agree that secondary reasons add no normative force to primary reasons. This does not entail that they have zero weight, for they might be thought to inherit their weight from primary reasons, and it might be denied that one is permitted to add the forces of primary and secondary reasons together. The authors plausibly contend that the relation between primary and secondary reasons is best understood as a constitution relation (if one wishes to defend secondary reasons at all), but let us put that claim to one side (there may, in fact, be better ways of understanding the relation). Let us also put the promise-based example to one side, since it is an example where all the relevant considerations are assumed to be fully known to the agent (it is not irrelevant to assessing the secondary reasons view, but other examples may provide intuitions that pull us in a different direction). Now consider the possibility that ordinary agents are very often ignorant of (or only inchoately appreciate) many of the primary reasons that apply to them, and are much better at consciously picking up on and responding to secondary reasons. Atomists who wish to employ the secondary reasons approach should be sympathetic to this idea. Once one starts employing the primary/secondary reasons distinction, it seems plausible to suppose the direction of discovery is, in general, the reverse of the direction of explanation (and that the task of uncovering the atomistically-structured primary reasons is one that only the philosopher carries out in a systematic manner). Furthermore, this would provide an interesting explanation of why particularists have been led astray by the holism that appears to ordinary agents to be almost everywhere. The authors may be failing to appreciate that while secondary reasons might ultimately add nothing to primary reasons in terms of (externally identified) normative force, they may inherit all the normative force of primary reasons for those who are unaware of the primary reasons. Secondary reasons may thus make an enormous difference to deliberation and action under conditions of ignorance vis-à-vis primary reasons. Such reasons are clearly not "entirely epiphenomenal" (p. 134).

Whatever the reader thinks of this skeletal sketch of an alternative generalist approach (admittedly, it might well be thought that much more needs to be said before it can be properly assessed), it is worth pointing out that this approach would at least avoid a problem for the authors that can be seen to arise when one considers what is said about principles in the last two chapters of the book at the same time as keeping in mind their earlier rejection of the secondary reasons view. In Chapter 9, the authors point out that a corporate whistleblower making a decision "might cite a principle no more complex than 'Deceiving people for profit is wrong'" (p. 197). They consider the possibility that the whistleblower might be acting on "further considerations beyond those contained in the foregoing expression of the rule", but admit that "it seems ad hoc to assume that this must be what is happening in every case", and conclude that "moral agents seem regularly to be guided by shockingly crude rules, rules that even by our own lights could never function as genuine standards" (p. 197). Fortunately, there may be "a reliable and systematic connection between crude moral rules and right action." (p. 198). They consider two ways of understanding this connection, one from the utilitarian tradition (following crude rules brings about good outcomes) and one from the natural law tradition (crude rules are local specifications of general, essentially under-specified principles), and argue that both have some merit. Notice that both these ways of understanding the connection require agents to be able to take up a more general perspective in order to assess the validity or otherwise of the simple rules (the perspective of Hare's "critical moral thinking", or the perspective of the general under-specified principles). There is an alternative that they fail to mention (perhaps because they believe they have established it is untenable): the simple principles that ordinary agents are familiar with (and which may sometimes look like they are plausible candidates for moral knowledge) may concern secondary reasons.

The fact that an act is an act of deceiving someone might not always mean that there is a primary reason against it, but on some occasions the fact that an act of deceiving someone is an act of causing undeserved pain (say) might mean that, on those occasions, there is a primary reason against it that grounds a secondary reason (not to deceive). This is merely meant as a hypothetical example, but I hope it makes the alternative vivid: ordinary agents may track deception qua reason, even though mention of deception might not feature in the correct moral theory.

The arguments of these later chapters (particularly Chapter 9) are, to a large extent, aimed at agents who fall short of being practically wise. The authors provide good reasons for thinking that agents that have yet to identify the ultimate moral principles (which, very plausibly, includes all presently living agents) will still generally be better off following principles than they would be if they were to give up on principles altogether. Nonetheless, it seems to follow from the theory of generalism developed in the book that a great deal of the time such agents are following principles that are, strictly speaking, false, and responding directly to considerations that are, strictly speaking, not really reasons at all.

All in all, Principled Ethics is a highly stimulating read. It moves the particularism debate on to a whole new level of sophistication, raising the bar that needs to be jumped by particularists considerably higher. At the same time, it provides important new insights into the nature and value of moral principles for those of us that avow a firm commitment to them.