Principles of Non-Philosophy

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François Laruelle, Principles of Non-Philosophy, Nicola Rubczak and Anthony Paul Smith (trs.), Bloomsbury, 2013, 315pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9781441177568.

Reviewed by Keith Whitmoyer, New York City College of Technology


This book will be of interest to people working in or close to questions of disciplinarity and disciplinary boundaries, speculative realism, as well as other critiques of the Kantian and continental post-Kantian tradition, specifically phenomenology and deconstruction. It will also be of interest to those working in the philosophy of immanence, viz. Deleuze and Michel Henry, and also to those working in or near phenomenology and deconstruction, particularly in light of the challenge it offers. Laruelle introduces a somewhat idiosyncratic, non-philosophical vocabulary and often uses familiar terms in tension with their typical meaning, which makes the text challenging at times. My intention is only to set up what I take to be Laruelle's problematic and offer some indications of how the book addresses it. I will not attempt to evaluate the success of what he proposes, but I will try to provide some indications of what is implied by the possibility of that success.

It seems as though for millennia philosophers have been posing the question: what is it that I am doing, exactly? There is no shortage of responses: the pursuit of the good life, the revelation of the forms, the revelation of God, metaphysics, hand-maidenship, critique, therapy, genealogy, research, fundamental ontology, archeology, deconstruction, and the list goes on. It seems that most philosophers have taken their turn defining (and defending) the meaning and principles of the philosophical enterprise. What virtually all proposals have in common is that they presuppose that this question can be answered within the domain of the philosophical itself itself. In other words, we mostly have a history of philosophers philosophizing about philosophizing -- in a word, meta-philosophy.

Meta-philosophy is, in a sense, founded on the assumption that only philosophy thinks, and therefore thinking about the meaning of the philosophical can only take place within the domain of the philosophical itself. There is something strange about this assumption. It seems as if meta-philosophy catches us in a circle. In trying to elaborate or understand the meaning of the philosophical, we simply continue to philosophize and thereby only manage to reproduce the philosophical ad nauseam. This reproduction results from the fact that we are attempting to understand this enterprise from the inside. In meta-philosophy there is a doubling-back of philosophy on itself, but as a result of this doubling-back, we never manage to get beyond the frontiers of the philosophical. Is it really the case that we can answer the question, "What is philosophy?" simply by philosophizing faster, stronger, or better and thus end only by duplicating what we were asking about? The problem with meta-philosophy is that, because we end up only philosophizing about philosophizing, we are never able to take a stand on what this is from the outside. The philosophical itself, because it remains the standpoint of inquiry, never truly succeeds in becoming an object of inquiry.

Laruelle takes up the task of demarcating a domain from which we could make the philosophical itself an object of thinking rather than the standpoint of thinking. This domain must not already be subject to the law of the philosophical; it must not "auto-position" itself within the philosophical; it must not be meta-philosophical but must be non-philosophical. The questions for this text are the following. How is it possible to think about philosophy from a perspective that is no longer automatically subsumed within the philosophical, that looks in from the outside? More generally: how is it possible to take up the task of thinking in a manner no longer under the thrall of philosophical authority? Is it possible to overthrow the philosophical's self-appointed and privileged access to the Real in the name of disciplinary democracy?

Laruelle therefore, does not claim that his book is a work of meta-philosophy -- he does not even claim it is a work of philosophy but of non-philosophy. The non-philosophical is the outside of philosophy, a point of view from which it is possible to see the philosophical itself and criticize it but also from which it is possible to reassign the task of thinking through a democratic disciplinary process. In demarcating the zone of the non-philosophical, Laruelle intends to open up this task anew. All philosophical thinking, it seems, moves in this direction: thinking (philosophy)  the Real. Non-philosophy introduces another direction -- not an inverted Kantianism, as he says, but non-Kantianism (Laruelle 257): through the "force-(of)-thought" we move from the Real  thinking (non-philosophy). As he puts it,

The problem is of inventing and discovering, undoubtedly simultaneously, a thought which, without negating philosophy, without wishing for its death, without subordinating it once again, merely suspends its claims over the Real and makes a new usage of philosophy with a view to constituting an order of thought more rigorous and more real than philosophy itself. (4)

Through demarcating the domain of non-philosophy we are better positioned to take up and think about the philosophical again by taking it as an object of theoretical elaboration. Because the non-philosophical is no longer subject to the authority and rule of the philosophical and its self-proclaimed sufficiency, it is possible to introduce a kind of disciplinary pragmatism: to put the philosophical to use in heretofore un-thought modalities of the task of thinking, constituting a praxis of thought that would (potentially) surpass the philosophical in its accomplishments.

What all philosophies have in common is the "Principle of Sufficient Philosophy" and one of the aims of articulating the principles of non-philosophy is to demarcate a zone beyond the efficacy of such a principle. Philosophy begins with the presupposition that it is sufficient for interpreting and accessing the Real by assuming its potency and adequacy. From this point of view, the non-philosophical itself remains precisely un-thought to the extent that it is reduced to only a marginal phenomenon, a mirror, the function of which is only to reflect the centrality and authority of the philosophical.

Each philosophy defines then a non-philosophical margin that it tolerates, circumscribes, reappropriates, or which it uses in order to expropriate itself: as a beyond or other to philosophical mastery. "So its concern is with a 'non' whose content and means of action [agent] are ontic or empirical, ontological in the best of cases, but whose reach is limited by this mastery" (2).

Philosophy condescends to speak of the non-philosophical -- the Other rather than Being, Difference rather than Identity -- only in order to reaffirm its own dominion and power. Philosophy welcomes its others only as auxiliaries and only to the extent to which they pay homage and thus contribute to constituting the authority of the philosophical (2). Precisely by being other to philosophy, this derivative non-philosophical demarcates the zone of what philosophy tolerates and defines its logic of inclusion and exclusion. From this perspective, the marginal only has the function of reflecting and defining the center.

If the task at hand is to make the philosophical visible from the outside, then this requires the de-centering of this center and the reversal of the Principle of Sufficient Philosophy: articulating the domain of the non-philosophical itself, not as derivative and secondary with respect to the philosophical but as primary. The non-philosophical is no longer to be understood as a marginal "object" under the gaze of the philosophical but the reverse. The philosophical is now only one "material" among others (the arts, ethics, science) -- a material that non-philosophy can deploy and utilize. This task, therefore, "concerns a new practice of philosophy, more universal than philosophy because it liberates itself from some of its postulates -- in particular that of its correspondence to the Real, of its convertability with the Real" (3). Articulating the domain of the non-philosophical itself (rather than speaking of the non-philosophical from the standpoint of the philosophical) requires overthrowing the authoritarianism of philosophical sufficiency -- in showing the philosophical's inadequacy and insufficiency with respect to the Real.

This revolution requires another reversal: while the philosophical proceeds from its own positionality toward the Real, which it assumes it can access and dominate, the non-philosophical proceeds from the radical immanence and foreclosure of the Real. Non-philosophy, in opposition to the philosophical's self-appointed sovereignty, allows the Real its immanence and self-identity. The Real is immanent to itself -- it is its only content, and it therefore remains foreclosed to thought. The Real exerts a causal force on thinking (rather than functioning as a transcendental ground), and it is the work of non-philosophy to demonstrate this force and think with it (rather than resisting it as the philosophical does). Instead of subsuming it under its lordship, non-philosophy takes up the causal nexuses that emanate outwardly from the Real. It is in this sense that non-philosophy can be identified with non-Kantianism. The Real is non-phenomenological -- given-without-givenness:

the Real is in some part necessarily unquestionable and undeconstructable. The Real must rather be already given even outside every operation of givenness, ontological or scientific, which would precisely possibilize it and would take it out of its "being-given". We are no longer within philosophical questioning here, not even at its margins, but rather in another mode of thought that thinks under the necessary and first condition of the Real as given without presupposition, and which is not itself a presupposed. (92-93)

The Real is, in a sense, the plane of radical immanence, and what Laruelle says of the Real is quite intentionally designed to come into tension with the philosophical and the various permutations that accompany it: the Real is self-identical rather than other, indifferent rather than different, causal rather than transcendental, radically immanent rather than transcendent. Because of its self-identity, Laruelle will also refer to it as the One or, more precisely, the One-in-One:

It is not that the One is foreign to philosophy; it is that it renders itself foreign to it and condemns it to its own foreclosure, specifically the foreclosure of the Real. . . . In comparison to the transcendentals of ontology and mysticism, the One taken up by non-philosophy is neither transcendent nor transcendental; it is only immanent or real, immanent through-and-through; an immanence (to) itself rather than just to itself; rather than to Being, to the Ego, to Life, to Substance, etc. (22)

Such oppositions understandably cut across the analyses of the text for the task is, after all, to demarcate the non-philosophical from the philosophical. In virtue of an immanence that surpasses what he describes as "philosophies of radical immanence" (Deleuze and Henry figure here) -- in virtue of its identity with itself -- the real-One is radically indifferent. It is closed in (on) itself and therefore no philosophical gestures or linguistics can approach it. To this extent, the real-One is also radically autonomous -- it requires and expects nothing from the philosophical, which always begins by assuming that the real-One depends on it for its manifestation. Likewise, the real-One offers nothing to the philosophical -- "offers nothing" indifferently, not even a refusal. Non-philosophy thus dispenses with mirrors, refractions, and reflections of the real-One: "The Real is not an object of representation and consequently auto-representation; the One cannot be reflected as it is" (137) -- it can only be "cloned" (30).

The non-metaphysical sobering is here: that the Real is neither the possible nor the impossible; neither the symbolizable nor the non-symbolizable posited as first, but that it is the cause by immanence which explains the possibility of the symbol without necessarily being symmetrically to assume the Real knowable. (222)

While there is perhaps some kinship, it is the radical immanence, singularity, indifference, and autonomy of the real-One that differentiates it from the Kantian noumenal:

The Real is more like Kant's 'thing-in-itself': unknowable and even unthinkable, but with the difference that it is not so from transcendence but from immanence (the One and not the Other) foreclosed and that it consists in an experience or a knowing of the third type, the vision-in-One. (222)

Laruelle will take up all the revisions implicated here: the meaning of the transcendental itself, of the a priori, of formal and transcendental logic, and the promise of this work seems to lie in the manner in which it figures strangely both as a radical style of transcendental thought (rather than philosophy) and yet is nonetheless decisively opposed to it (precisely to the extent that transcendental thought remains philosophical).

The philosophical proceeds from its auto-positionality toward the Real with the pretense of its openness (rather than its foreclosure). The non-philosophical proceeds in the other direction, and yet this raises the important question of what relationship thinking can have to the Real, i.e., to that which is radically indifferent to it. Laruelle's solution is too complex to detail here, but the central concept is the "force-(of)-thought", or FT. On one level, the force-(of)-thought is the non-philosophical counterpart to the role traditionally played by subjectivity in philosophy. It is also, however, "the theoretical instrument of philosophy's non-philosophical transformation. It is only an organon, the force of decision-making, itself determined-in-the-last-instance by the Real" (232). It is the latter remark that is important -- FT does not proceed on the ground of the philosophical but is a function of, a tool of the Real as a causal (rather than transcendental) principle. Unlike the philosophical, which thrives on mixture and "amphibology," FT proceeds uni-directionally and uni-latterally from the Real. It is thanks to FT -- and because non-philosophy itself is a mode of FT -- that the non-philosophical is able to overthrow philosophical authoritarianism.

FT marks the passage from the unitary or authoritarian power of auto-positioning Reason to the power of thought that determines-in-the-last-instance the forms of philosophical and scientific rationality. Reason ceases to be auto-examiner and auto-limiter, tribunal for its claims, in order to be examined from a heteronomous instance (by heteronomous by immanence). (265)

FT carries us through the philosophical to its outer-reaches and beyond into the space of the non-philosophical. It is through this force -- which is the expression of the causal power of the real-One -- that, freed from the burdens of philosophical sufficiency, we can look back and finally see the philosophical itself at work. From this vantage, the philosophical shows itself -- not as the center -- but as one body, one material, among others. There is no longer a question of a Copernican turn, which still posits a center, but of a more galactic or even universal standpoint that always seeks to de-centralize, relativize, and in so doing, see from without.

This book is challenging because it invites the reader to think beyond the conventions of the philosophical. It proposes a fascinating and radical confrontation with current modalities of thinking, especially phenomenology, deconstruction, and the philosophies of radical immanence. The important question for Laruelle is the extent to which he succeeds in taking us to and beyond the frontier and into the outer reaches. If it does succeed, then his book constitutes one of the most considerable challenges to the project of transcendental thought and is probably one of the important texts of the time.