Principles of Truth

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Halbach, Volker and Horsten, Leon (eds), Principles of Truth, Hansel-Hohenhausen, 2002, 244pp, EUR 66,00, ISBN 3826712048.

Reviewed by Gabriel Uzquiano, University of Rochester


Two strands of research are prominent in the philosophical literature on truth. One is provoked by the semantic paradoxes and makes extensive use of mathematical methods in order to develop sophisticated formal theories of truth. The other attempts to answer such philosophical questions as what it is for a putative truth bearer to be true or false or what practical and theoretical purposes are accomplished by our use of a truth predicate. The present volume consists of nine excellent articles on the interface between the two areas by distinguished logicians and philosophers. The collection aspires to draw attention to important connections between technical developments and insights from philosophical reflection on truth in the conviction that they will illuminate each other.

The editors have divided the articles in the volume in three groups. The articles by John P. Burgess, Paul Horwich, Volker Halbach, and Stewart Shapiro are concerned with the debate over deflationism. Two articles by Hannes Leitgeb and Vann McGee are grouped under the label “semantic approaches to truth.” The last three articles by Michael Sheard and Andrea Cantini, and Leon Horsten deal with axiomatic theories of truth and informal provability. In all but one case, the articles report on the author’s contribution to the conference Truth, Necessity, and Provability organized by the editors in Leuven, Belgium, in 1999.

The volume begins with an extended introduction in which the editors provide an excellent overview of a wide range of issues and technical developments in the literature on truth since Tarski (1935). This includes a valuable discussion of Tarski’s theory of truth, a superb account of the debate over deflationism and conservativeness, and a helpful outline of prominent typed and type-free approaches to truth. There are, however, occasional omissions that may disconcert a reader who is not careful to read between the lines. For example, when the editors write “PA(S) is conservative over PA” in the last paragraph of page 22, one should read: “PA(S) without the induction axioms involving truth is conservative over PA.” But this doesn’t detract from the value of the introduction as an attractive map of contemporary research on truth that stresses critical forks in the road and provides the reader with useful background for much of the discussion undertaken in subsequent articles.

1. Deflationism.

The discussion of deflationism makes up the first and largest part of the book.

Deflationism is a general approach to truth that includes a wide range of more specific proposals such as minimalist theories of truth, disquotationalist theories, prosentential theories, redundancy theories and others. What is perhaps the most distinctive mark of all these views is the claim that, in general, an attribution of truth to a truth bearer is trivially equivalent to the truth bearer in question, and that it is precisely this equivalence that endows truth with its practical and theoretical utility. Different deflationists may differ with respect to whether they take utterances, sentences, or propositions to be the truth bearers, but they all reserve a special status for the equivalences between attributions of truth to truth bearers and the truth bearers in question. These equivalences are often summarized by an equivalence schema, which, again, different deflationists characterize differently. Moreover, the explanation of the respects in which instances of the equivalence schema are central to truth varies from proposal to proposal.

The volume opens with “Is There a Problem about the Deflationary Theory of Truth?” by John P. Burgess. This article attempts to isolate an optimal formulation of the deflationary position. To take up this task, Burgess must confront two different problems at once. One is the problem of how to formulate the equivalence schema itself, and the other is the problem of how to make precise the claim that its instances are somehow central to truth. In the end, Burgess argues for his preferred formulation of the deflationary thesis as superior to a range of other candidates he considers:

Grasping the meaning of ‘true’ consists in grasping that, as matter of meaning, the following is assertable:
That _____________ is true if and only if ________________. (41-42)

For all its virtues, this characterization of deflationism makes crucial use of the notion of assertability, and hence of assertion. And, as Burgess himself concludes, this suggests that deflationists must make it plausible that an account of assertion may be given that doesn’t presuppose truth.

One particularly well-developed variety of deflationism is Paul Horwich’s minimalism about truth. As articulated and defended in his 1998 and 1991, a central ingredient of minimalism is the thesis that the content of the truth predicate is exhausted by all (non-paradoxical) instances of the schema:

The proposition that p is true if and only if p.

The principal burden of Horwich’s contribution to this volume, “Defense of Minimalism,” is to clarify and defend this minimalist thesis against a wide array of objections, some due to Horwich himself, some due to other prominent philosophers.

The next two articles in the volume are concerned with different aspects of the question of whether a satisfactory formal theory of truth may be developed in the spirit of disquotationalism.

Disquotationalism is a species of deflationism that takes truth as a device for disquotation and semantic generalization; a truth predicate allow us to express infinite conjunctions and disjunctions in a finitary language. Moreover, (T)-sentences are, on this view, akin to analytic truths. This outlook immediately motivates certain formal disquotational theories of truth. For suppose ∑ is some first-order theory that is able to develop some syntax for its own language L. And let LT be the expansion of L by a one-place predicate T. We obtain a disquotational theory of truth ∑T for L if we let ∑T be ∑ plus all instances of the (T)-schema:

T([φ]) <-> φ,

where [φ] is the code (or Gödel number) of a sentence φ of L. Unfortunately, as Tarski himself observed, ∑T is not a satisfactory theory of truth. For one reason, ∑T is unable to prove even the most harmless semantic generalizations. For example, for each sentence φ of L, ∑T proves:

T([φ]) ∨T([~φ]),

where [φ] and [~φ] are the codes of a sentence φ and its negation, respectively. What the theory doesn’t prove is the generalization:

∀x (Sentence(x) → (T(x) ∨T(neg(x)))),

where neg(x) is a term for a function whose value for any number that is the code of a sentence φ is [~φ]. The generalization depends upon an infinite number of axioms, but no proof may use more than a finite number of premises. A similar problem afflicts generalizations to the effect, for example, that other connectives and quantifiers commute with truth, let alone those that state that the axioms of the base theory are true or that the rules of inference preserve truth.

In “Modalized Disquotationalism,” Volker Halbach proposes a novel solution to this problem. The suggestion is to replace the (T)-sentences by an axiom that states that all (T)-sentences are, in fact, necessary. This requires one to expand the base language by both a one-place truth predicate T and a one-place necessity predicate N. Then one must expand the base theory with axioms designed to govern the added predicates. As one would expect, Montague’s paradox (see Montague 1963) imposes severe restrictions on the axioms one may adopt for N, and the proposed restrictions may seem somewhat artificial. However, the presence of a necessity predicate allows one to state Halbach’s axiom that all (T)-sentences are necessary. And the result is an attractive family of disquotational theories of truth that are able to prove, for example, that the truth predicate commutes with all the connectives and quantifiers.

Admittedly, Halbach’s solution is not what one might have initially expected. Instead, one might have attempted, for example, to augment the base theory by Tarski-style inductive clauses defining truth (or satisfaction). In two recent articles, Stewart Shapiro 1998 and Jeffrey Ketland 1999 have independently cast doubt upon the availability of certain satisfactory Tarski-style theories of truth for adherents of deflationism. They noticed that some such theories yield as (first-order) consequences sentences of the base language (in which the truth predicate is not involved) that are not consequences of the base theory alone. In other words, some satisfactory Tarski-style theories of truth are not conservative over the base theory. But, they argued, deflationary theories of truth shouldn’t deliver non-semantic information not previously encoded in the axioms of the base theory.

In “Deflation and Conservation,” Stewart Shapiro takes stock of the debate and responds to objections to his criticism of deflationism. After a helpful clarification of the technical situation, Shapiro refines the conservativeness constraint one should reasonably expect deflationary theories to satisfy. He then revisits a dilemma for deflationists who accept the conservativeness constraint: either they replace first-order consequence by a non-effective consequence relation in order to restore the conservativeness of satisfactory theories of truth or they had better be prepared to fall back to conservative, but presumably unsatisfactory, theories of truth.

2. Semantic Approaches to Truth.

The articles grouped under the label semantic approaches to truth are motivated by very different concerns.

The article by Hannes Leitgeb, “Metaworlds: A Possible Worlds Semantics for Truth,” explores a possible worlds semantics for truth. A sentence φ is thus assigned a set of possible worlds that, he suggests, corresponds to the proposition it expresses. A sentence of the form T([φ]) is then true in a world w just in case φ is true in all accessible worlds to which w is related. In some cases, when Tarski’s policy to separate the object language from a strictly richer metalanguage is observed, the accessibility relation may be the identity relation. Of particular interest, however, is the fact that when the language contains its own truth predicate, the accessibility relation gives rise to frames that are familiar from temporal logics. This strikes one as a fact that cries out for an explanation.

In “Ramsey and the Correspondence Theory,” Vann McGee is concerned with a prominent alternative to deflationary conception of truth. He discusses a correspondence account on which the activities of speakers are taken to forge connections between linguistic expressions and their semantic values, which, in turn, explain the truth conditions speakers attach to sentences. Unfortunately, this correspondence account faces formidable obstacles on account of vagueness and inscrutability of reference. If the activities of speakers are unable to pin down a referent for a name like ‘Kilimanjaro’, then it seems hopeless to suppose that sentences like ‘Kilimanjaro is the highest mountain of Africa’ acquire their truth conditions compositionally from the semantic values affixed to its components. How then are such sentences ascribed the truth conditions they have by the activities of speakers?

The primary purpose of McGee’s contribution is to outline an answer to this question. The answer is inspired in Ramsey’s program for theoretical sentences, but it is framed in terms of Tarski’s 1936 consequence relation, which makes no allowance for varying domains of discourse. The proposal is to declare a sentence to be true if and only if it is a Tarski consequence of the union with the theory speakers accept of the set of true observation sentences. The suggestion is that the truth conditions of a sentence like ‘Kilimanjaro is the highest mountain of Africa’ depend on how speakers use the words contained in the sentence, and this, in turn, depends in part on what their beliefs are.

3. Axiomatic Theories of Truth and Intensionality.

The last part of the volume is mostly concerned with axiomatic theories of truth and informal provability.

Michael Sheard, in “Truth, Provability, and Naive Criteria,” identifies six different criteria, based on central features of our use of the truth predicate, that one might use to assess both formal semantic and axiomatic approaches to truth. Each criterion has significant consequences for the comparative evaluation of systems such as the revision theory of truth, Kripke’s fixed-point semantics, or variants of the Kripke-Feferman system of partial truth. Sheard touches on the debate over deflationism, since he intimates that conservative theories of truth may, in fact, contravene some of the criteria he discusses.

The next contribution discusses an axiomatic characterization of Kripke’s fixed-point construction known as the Kripke-Feferman theory (KF) of partial truth. In “Partial Truth”, Andrea Cantini surveys results on the semantics and proof-theoretic strength of KF and some of its variants. He explores, for example, a variant of KF that he thinks is a candidate to be a deflationary, type-free theory of truth. And he looks at consequences of KF in the context, for example, of intuitionistic logic, to conclude that KF is, in fact, sensitive to the ground logic.

The last article in the volume discusses intensional paradoxes afflicting necessity, knowledge, and informal provability. Richard Montague (1963) observed that if, in the context of Robinson’s arithmetic, we expand the language of arithmetic by a one-place predicate π, then we cannot expect our theory to contain all instances of the reflection principle:

(i) π([φ]) → φ,

and be closed under the rule:

(ii) From φ to infer π([φ]).

Montague’s paradox is the observation that these expectations are contradictory. This presents us with a problem when we attempt to interpret π([φ]) as: “φ is necessary”, but, as Kaplan and Montague (1960) had noticed, similar problems arise when we attempt to interpret π([φ]) as: “φ is known.” In “An Axiomatic Investigation of Provability as a Primitive Predicate,” Leon Horsten is concerned with the interpretation of π in terms of informal provability. One attractive answer to Montague’s paradox is to restrict (ii) to disavow inferences from reflection to instances of: π([π([φ]) → φ]). But after an extended discussion of some implementations of this proposal, Horsten concludes that it doesn’t survive careful scrutiny. In the end, he suggests, the solution to Montague’s paradox will require us to restrict reflection. The article concludes with a discussion of the connection between the semantic paradoxes and the intensional paradoxes afflicting knowledge, necessity, and informal provability.

The deflationary conception of truth is, however, the prevalent theme of the volume. Even articles that are not primarily concerned with deflationism raise issues that effectively connect with the discussion of deflationism. Thus, for example, Andrea Cantini reports on the search for type-free theories of truth that capture the deflationary outlook, and Michael Sheard comments on the risks of adopting conservative theories of truth. The result is a compact volume whose treatment of deflationism makes plain that there is a continuity between the technical development of formal theories of truth and philosophical reflection on the role of truth. To the extent that this is one of the primary aims of the editors, the volume is largely successful.

There is, however, some irony in the fact that the semantic paradoxes seem to pose a particularly urgent problem for correspondence accounts of truth. To be sure, the semantic paradoxes afflict both deflationary and correspondence theories of truth. But while it seems in principle open to deflationists to restrict the equivalence schema to a suitably limited range of non-paradoxical instances without real harm to the position, correspondence theorists are forced into the rather uncomfortable position of admitting that we are far from understanding the connection between the truth bearers and the facts in virtue of which true attributions of truth are true and false attributions are false. Thus, as a look at Vann McGee’s article suggests, there is a great potential for interaction between reflection on correspondence accounts of truth and technical research on the semantic paradoxes.

Be that as it may, the editors have produced a highly attractive volume that contains a wealth of remarkably suggestive material for both logicians and philosophers. No one with an interest in truth and the semantic paradoxes will want to miss this book.


Horwich, P. (1991) Truth, Basil Blackwell, Oxford.

Horwich, P. (1998) Truth, Oxford University Press, Oxford, second edition.

Kaplan, D., and R. Montague (1960) “A Paradox Regained,” The Notre Dame Journal of Formal Logic 1, 79-90.

Ketland, J. (1999) “Deflationism and Tarski’s Paradise,” Mind 108, 69-94.

Montague, R. (1963) “Syntactic Treatments of Modality, with Corollaries on Reflection Principles and Finite Axiomatizability.” In Richard Montague, Formal Philosophy pp. 286-302.

Montague, R., ed. (1974) Formal Philosophy, Yale University Press, New Haven.

Shapiro, S. (1998) “Proof and Truth: Through Thick and Thin,” Journal of Philosophy 10, 493-521.

Tarski, A. (1935) “The Concept of Truth in Formalized Languages” 152-278. In Alfred Tarski, Logic, Semantics and Meta-Mathematics.

Tarski, A. (1936) “On the Concept of Logical Consequence” 409-420. In Alfred Tarski, Logic, Semantics and Meta-Mathematics.

Tarski, A. (1983) Logic, Semantics and Meta-Mathematics, Hackett, Indiana, second edition.