Prior Analytics: Book I

Placeholder book cover

Aristotle, Prior Analytics: Book I, Gisela Striker (translation and commentary), Oxford UP, 2009, 268pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780199250417.

Reviewed by John Corcoran, University of Buffalo


 Gisela Striker, the author of this translation and commentary, is a prolific and respected scholar, a leading figure in a large and still rapidly growing area of scholarship: Prior Analytics studies (PAS). PAS treats many aspects of Aristotle’s Prior Analytics: historical context, previous writings that influenced it, preservation and transmission of its manuscripts, editions of its manuscripts, interpretations, commentaries, translations, and its influence on subsequent logic, philosophy, and mathematics. All this attention is warranted because Prior Analytics marks the origin of logic: the field that, among other things, asks of a given proposition whether it follows from a given set of propositions; and, if it follows, how we determine that it follows; and, if it does not follow, how we determine that it does not follow.

Striker is currently Professor of Philosophy and Classics at Harvard University. Her doctoral supervisor was Günther Patzig, the most noted German scholar in this area. His important 1959 book Die aristotelische Syllogistik was translated into English in 1968 by the Oxford professor Jonathan Barnes as Aristotle’s Theory of the Syllogism; it continues to be consulted.

The Renaissance in PRIOR ANALYTICS Studies

Since its Boolean origin in the middle 1800s, modern logic never completely forgot Aristotle’s logic. De Morgan quoted and discussed certain passages in Prior Analytics. Aristotle’s logic was prominent in Boole’s writings and it was mentioned by Frege and by Hilbert. Nevertheless the first years of mathematical logic did not take it seriously enough to do a thorough study of Aristotle’s text.

A renaissance in PAS began in the early 1950s with the publication of the landmark Aristotle’s Syllogistic from the Standpoint of Modern Formal Logic by Jan Łukasiewicz, Oxford UP 1951, 2nd ed. 1957. Łukasiewicz was a distinguished mathematical logician. He created many-valued logic and the parenthesis-free prefix notation known as Polish notation. He co-authored with Alfred Tarski an important paper on the metatheory of propositional logic, and he was one of Tarski’s three main teachers at the University of Warsaw. Łukasiewicz’s stature was just short of that of the giants: Aristotle, Boole, Frege, Tarski and Gödel. No twentieth-century mathematical logician of his caliber had ever before quoted the actual teachings of ancient logicians.

Not only did Łukasiewicz inject fresh hypotheses, new concepts, new methods, and imaginative modern perspectives into the field, his enormous prestige and that of the Warsaw School of Logic reflected on the whole field of Prior Analytics studies. Suddenly, this previously somewhat neglected, dormant, and obscure field became active, and it gained in respectability and importance in the eyes of logicians, mathematicians, linguists, analytic philosophers, and historians. The Łukasiewicz-led revolution brought about a paradigm shift in PAS. Next to Aristotle himself, Łukasiewicz is the most prominent figure in Prior Analytics studies. A huge literature traces its origins to Łukasiewicz. Patzig was one of the early defenders of the most revolutionary of Łukasiewicz’s ideas.

The work under review appears in the Clarendon Aristotle Series “designed both for students and professionals.” Striker intends the commentary to be an aid “in reading Aristotle’s treatise as a foundational text in the history of logic.” This is only the second translation by a renaissance scholar. It follows by exactly twenty years the ground-breaking 1989 work of Robin Smith – Aristotle, Prior Analytics, Hackett Publishing, Indianapolis and Cambridge MA. At Passover Seders we ask: “How is this night different from all others?” At each new translation we ask: “How is this translation different from all others?” Often the translator answers, explains why the new translation improves on previous ones. But not in this case: the reader must do the comparisons without help from the translator, who acknowledges benefitting from previous translations without mentioning them and without saying what the benefits were.

I know of seven English translations of all or important parts of Prior Analytics that have been published since the first complete translation by Thomas Taylor in the early 1800s: Owen 1853, Jenkinson 1923, Tredennick 1938, Warrington 1964, Apostle and Gerson 1982, Smith 1989, and Striker 2009. The bibliography of this book lists only Jenkinson and Smith.

Prior Analytics

Prior Analytics is a relatively short work: roughly 50 pages in Greek editions, roughly 100 pages in recent English translations. Of its two parts, or “books,” the first Book, designated by the Roman numeral I or by the letter A, is by far the larger — about twice as large as Book II, or B — and by far the more important. Book A, which alone is translated in the work reviewed, is divided into 46 “chapters.” One of the challenging, intriguing, and exasperating aspects of Prior Analytics is that it cannot be regarded as a considered and definitive statement of the teachings of its author. Arduous philological investigation has established that it consists of an interweaving of material such as research and lecture notes written at different times and never intended to be presented as a “publication.” Its inadequacies are painfully evident from its first pages.

Historians of formal logic have focused much of their attention on seven chapters: 1, 2, 4, 5, 6, 7, and 23 — about 12 English pages, the most intensely studied 12 pages in the literature of logic. The statement that Aristotle founded formal logic is fully justified by the content of these chapters — given what is known about the historical context. These chapters establish three of his most important contributions: (1) his “truth-and-consequence” theory of demonstration — how we gain demonstrative knowledge, (2) his “immediate-deduction-chaining” theory of deduction — how we determine that a given proposition follows, and (3) his counterargument or counterinterpretation theory — how we determine that a given proposition does not follow. Key supplementary points are made here and there in other chapters of Books A and B and in Aristotle’s next work Posterior Analytics.

The two works, Prior Analytics and Posterior Analytics, form a single work known as the Analytics, which develops Aristotle’s views on logic, demonstrative science, and axiomatic method. Many of his examples in both works are geometrical. According to Owen (1853, 80): "the names Prior and Posterior [Analytics] were given to these treatises in the time of Galen, but it is remarkable that when Aristotle cites them, he denominates the former ‘Concerning Syllogism’ and the later ‘Concerning Demonstration’.“

”NDPRBodyTexT">Today it is widely held that the division of material between the two works corresponds to the Alonzo Church distinction between a topic neutral underlying logic and a topic-specific axiomatic science that presupposes the underlying logic’s deduction rules and principles for carrying out its chains of deduction. As Aristotle first noted, every science has its own specific topic, its domain of investigation, which forms the science’s universe of discourse. An underlying logic per se has no universe of discourse: it is not a series of statements; rather it is a human capacity often construed as involving a system of rules. Typically, the rules countenance deducing a conclusion from one or more premises: modus ponens and substitution of identicals come to mind. Atypically but importantly, there are zero-premise rules commonly but possibly misleadingly called “principles of reasoning”: excluded middle and self-identity come to mind.

It must be said however that Łukasiewicz and Patzig did not take Prior Analytics to be presenting an underlying logic. On the contrary they took it to be presenting an axiomatic science of the kind treated in Posterior Analytics. The axiomatic science they had in mind took as its universe of discourse a universe of “terms”: e.g., human, horse, animal, swan, stone. It was thus a forerunner of modern class theory. Łukasiewicz and Patzig recognized that this supposed axiomatic system in Prior Analytics required an underlying logic. They supposed the underlying logic to be a form of first-order logic, which includes propositional logic. They held that Aristotle used but was unaware of this underlying logic. Although they did not draw this conclusion, their view implied that Aristotle’s Prior Analytics was no more a logic book than Euclid’s Elements, which presented an axiomatic system without describing its underlying logic.


The earliest translators of Prior Analytics blazed a path that has been followed closely ever since. By frequent use the path became a rut, at first a narrow rut. Subsequent translators widened the rut in places, but in other places primeval arbitrariness, misunderstanding, and preconception — sanctified by repetition that became tradition — still constrict recent translators. Examples include assertoric, cause, figure, minor, major, ostensive, peculiar, particular, perfect, predicate, privative, reduce, singular, syllogism, and universal. By recent translators I refer, of course, to Robin Smith and Gisela Striker, whose translations have been published in book form, but I also wish to include Austin, Beth, Bochenski, Boger, Flannery, Crivelli, Gasser, Geach, Hintikka, Kahn, Łukasiewicz, Preus, Rose, Smiley, Torretti, Tracy, and others whose translations, whether partial or total, are available only in MSS or passages in learned journals, handbooks, notes, or correspondence. One of the difficulties is that the early translations coined words or expressions that made their way into ordinary speech. Thereafter, they became subject to the usual distorting forces operating in the evolution of any language. Consequently, expressions that might at one time have been more or less adequate to render Aristotle’s thought when originally proposed, now convey ideas other than those first intended. Another difficulty is that translators compulsively make literal translations of Aristotle’s Greek even when Aristotle’s original words were inadequate to convey his intentions. Aristotle not only needed to discover logic, he also needed to create a vocabulary with which to describe it.

Axiomatic First Principles

Aristotle’s “truth-and-consequence” demonstrations require ultimate premises known to be true in advance of deducing their consequences, which are only then the established conclusions of the demonstrations. To start a demonstration we need premises known to be true and a “problem” or “hypothesis” to aim for. How do we get started? How do we gain knowledge of these “principles,” or “first principles” — as older logicians would say — or “axioms” — as we might say today? Let us compare four translations of one of the passages addressing this question (A30, 46a17-20). The second in the series of English translations (Octavius Freire Owen 1853, 152-3) reads as follows.

The peculiar principles indeed in every science are many, hence it is the province of experience to deliver the principles of every thing, for instance, I say that astronomical experience gives us the principles of astrological science.

An old translation by Hugh Tredennick (1938, 357) reads:

Most of the principles, however, which are connected with a particular science are peculiar to it. Hence, to convey to us the principles connected with each particular science is the task of experience. I mean, e.g., that it is for astronomical experience to convey to us the principles of astronomy.

The relatively recent translation by Robin Smith (1989, 49) follows.

The majority of principles for each science are peculiar to it. Consequently, it is for our experiences concerning each subject to provide the principles. I mean, for instance, that it is for astronomical experience to provide the principles of the science of astronomy.

The English word ‘principle’, which translates the Greek archē, no longer carries the connotation of ‘starting place’, ‘origin’, ‘beginning’, etc. connected with its etymology. The word ‘first’ is often added to restore the lost connotation. However, the word ‘principle’ does continue to carry a connotation of ‘truth’, ‘fundamental law’, and the like — however loosely. Striker has the following on page 50.

However, most of the starting-points are peculiar to each science. That is why experience must provide the starting-points about each subject — I mean, for instance, experience in astronomy must provide the starting-points for astronomical science.

Striker quite awkwardly and unnecessarily used the now unusual substantive hyphenation ‘starting-point’: the noun phrase ‘starting point’ would serve as well. In fact, there are several other words that could be used: for example, ‘basis’, ‘beginning’, ‘grounding’, or ‘origin’. However, ‘starting-point’ does not carry a connotation of ‘truth’, ‘fundamental law’, and the like — which is carried by the Greek archē. Even more misleading is the absence of connotation of ‘certainty’, epistemic bedrock, traditionally attributed to Aristotelian first principles. It is entirely open to Striker’s readers to imagine that Aristotle allowed false starting-points or, less drastically, to imagine that Aristotle was vague on this point. Aristotle’s earlier characterization of “demonstrative premise” (A 1, 24a30) also uses archē. The Striker translation of this likewise omits connotation of certainty. It reads “true and accepted on the basis of initial assumptions.” For ‘accepted’ we need something stronger such as ‘known’ and for ‘assumptions’ we need something less subjective such as ‘first principles’.

All four translations seem to be stuck in a rut with the strange and awkward choice of ‘peculiar’, which necessarily carries the connotation of ‘abnormal’, ‘strange’, ‘puzzling’, ‘outlandish’, etc. None of these pejorative overtones are warranted: ‘specific’, ‘particular’, ‘unique’, ‘proper’, and ‘restricted’ would all be better. It is true that the Greek idios translated ‘peculiar’ can carry connotation of ‘strange’, ‘abnormal’, etc.: it eventually led to ‘idiot’ and ‘idiosyncrasy’. But surely Aristotle could have relied on his reader’s ability to filter that out.

Introduction and Commentary

The Striker commentary does not show the mastery of renaissance thinking in Prior Analytics studies that the reader has a right to expect. Moreover, there are several references that are in error. For example, on page 82 we find the following.

Corcoran (1974b), followed by Smith, tries to find a formal rather than an epistemological difference between perfect and imperfect syllogisms.

In the first place, the commentary never makes clear what this “formal rather than epistemological difference” would be. It is difficult to guess what might be meant. In the second place, for Corcoran, Smith, and all of the other contemporary renaissance scholars steeped in formal logic, the epistemic difference between perfect and imperfect syllogisms is fundamental. In a perfect syllogism it is evident that the conclusion follows without reference to other syllogisms. In an imperfect syllogism it is only by reference to other syllogisms that it becomes evident that the conclusion follows. Perfect is to imperfect in the realm of deduction as axiomatic is to demonstrative in the realm of science. This might help to explain why it was so easy for Łukasiewicz to take perfect syllogisms to be principles, or axioms. Whatever was meant by ‘formal’, the “rather than epistemological” reveals a deep misunderstanding of the philosophy of logic attributed to Aristotle by logic-oriented renaissance scholars.

The commentary gives only the most superficial discussions of the main renaissance interpretations, the differences among them, the philosophical and historical significance of the differences, and the arguments pro and con. The introduction (xiv) mentions the Łukasiewicz “axiomatic model of assertoric syllogistic” without giving any of the essential features or even saying which of the several current senses of the word ‘model’ is intended. It immediately adds that Patzig “provided a historically more accurate picture” without giving one example of Patzig’s corrections or even one example of Łukasiewicz’s supposed inaccuracies. It reports that “several critics pointed out that Lukasiewicz’s (sic) axiomatic model (which had been accepted by Patzig) was not a very adequate representation” without saying who the several critics were or what inadequacies they found. Nowhere in the book is it revealed how or even whether Patzig ever repudiated his well-known endorsement of the Łukasiewicz axiomatic interpretation of assertoric syllogistic. It asserts without explanation that Aristotle’s deductions are “more plausibly seen as derivations in a natural deduction calculus” without any indication of which natural deduction calculus is concerned or what explains the increased plausibility. It further asserts, without giving evidence, that the natural-deduction interpretation “is widely accepted.” Moreover, it alleges that “a first model of the natural deduction kind was published in German by K. Ebbinghaus in 1964” without giving any details of the Ebbinghaus “model” and without saying what interpretation of Prior Analytics Ebbinghaus proposed, if any, or what textual references Ebbinghaus cited in support. It also alleges that the 1973 and 1974 work of John Corcoran has been “more influential in the Anglophone literature,” thus simultaneously (1) failing to mention Timothy Smiley’s equally influential early 1970s work, (2) suggesting that the Ebbinghaus work has been more influential than the Corcoran work outside of Anglophone literature, and (3) suggesting that the Ebbinghaus work has been somewhat influential in the Anglophone literature. To the best of my knowledge the Ebbinghaus work has been largely ignored by all except for Patzig and one or two others. Smith 1989 does not mention it.

After seemingly endorsing in the Introduction the view that Prior Analytics is about deduction per se and that the system of deductions presented is a rule-based natural-deduction system, the Commentary contains the following puzzling passages.

It is natural for a modern reader to consider Aristotle’s system of syllogisms as a paradigm of axiomatized theory. — p. 72

However, it is not clear whether Aristotle also took the step of recognizing his formal theory of argument as a scientific discipline in its own right with the same logical structure as the first-order sciences. — pp. 73-4

The first passage seems perversely wrong. The second suggests, or perhaps even implies, that the Łukasiewicz axiomatic interpretation of assertoric syllogistic is correct. However, on page 86 Striker affirms that the Commentary “follows” the natural deduction interpretation.


This book is not suitable for use in an undergraduate course. It has too many quirks that the teacher would want to warn against: it rarely italicizes Organon, it rarely capitalizes the first letter of De Interpretatione, it is inconsistent in use of quotation marks to name expressions, and it introduces dozens of strange and improper hyphenations used as substantives: e.g., argument-form, class-relation, de dicto-interpretation, de dicto-de re, Euler-diagram, necessity-premise, premises-pairs, reductio-argument, term-example, term-relation, and ‘A belongs to B’-term. There are puzzling lapses in uniformity in style: e.g., although on the title page the work translated is called Book I, the chapters are never referred to with the Roman I: e.g., chapters 7 and 23 are called simply ‘A 7 and A 23’, chapters 3 and 8-22 are called ‘chs. 3 and 8-22’, chapter 25 is simply ‘25’, chapter 45 is called ‘chapter 45’. In the first 264 pages, the column designations in hundreds of Bekker numbers are meticulously superscripted as ‘24a10’ and ‘24b10’; thereafter on pages 265-6 all are printed in line as ‘24a10’ and ‘24b14’. Jenkinson and Smith both avoid all such superscripting. A copy editor should have dealt with these things and with other matters such as incorrect punctuation and improper end-of-line divisions. But perhaps the worst copy-editing flaw for a Łukasiewicz renaissance scholar is to write ‘Łukasiewicz’, the name of the founder of the tradition, without using the Polish el-slash. I have yet to find one proper occurrence of ‘Łukasiewicz’ in the book.

The prose is heavily laden with glaring clichés. The one-page preface contains “longer than I care to remember,” “more than I can possibly list here,” “first and foremost,” and “last and by no means least” — a sentence later is devoted to thanking the “incredibly meticulous and helpful copy-editor.” A few pages later the translator reveals the need “to find a path between the Scylla … and the Charybdis.”

Moreover, the index is far from meeting the needs of undergraduate students. There are only 7 entries beginning with the letter A, 6 with B, and 3 with C. In comparison, Smith has 18 beginning A, 11 B, and 28 C. There are no entries beginning with Q, U, or V. The following are among the words that are not listed at all: absurd, add/divide, affirm/deny, a fortiori, all, analyze, analytics, antecedent, argument, assume, axiom, axiomatized science, begging the question, Bekker, belonging, Boethius, class, conclusion, consequence, consequent, consistency, contradictory/contrary, contraries, counterexample. I stop with the Cs except to note that the physician Galen, called a philosopher in the Introduction, is not one of the three entries beginning G.

The attention to scholarly detail is not what one hoped for from Oxford University Press. Boethius is not listed in the index nor is his book listed in the Select Bibliography although it is referred to on page xiv. The item by Ebbinghaus that Barnes lists as a book in his Patzig translation is formatted as an article on page 255, except that no page numbers are given. The name of the journal containing Striker’s own 1985 article has three lowercase letters that should be capitalized. In at least two places there are potentially confusing misprints. At 26b10-15, this translation reads “let swan and white be chosen as white things” for what Smith correctly translates “let swan and snow be selected from among those white things.” At 41b16, “angles AB and CD” should read “angles AC and BD.”

Despite this book’s flaws, many of which are easily correctable in a second edition, it will be found useful if not indispensable for those currently engaged in the field of Prior Analytics studies, which is still in its infancy, as readers of this book will readily infer. The alternatives suggested to Robin Smith’s translation choices are often worth consideration. It is to be emphasized, however, that this book is unsuitable for those entering or seeking an introduction to Prior Analytics studies.

Acknowledgements: Allan Bäck, George Boger, Paolo Crivelli, Newton da Costa, William D’Alessandro, William Demopoulos, Marc Gasser, Leonard Jacuzzo, Calvin Jongsma, John Kearns, Justin Legault, Joaquin Miller, Frango Nabrasa, Carlo Penco, David Plache, Anthony Preus, José Miguel Sagüillo, Michael Scanlan, Robin Smith, Thomas Sullivan, Roberto Torretti, Kevin Tracy, and Jan von Plato.