Priority in Aristotle's Metaphysics

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Michail Peramatzis, Priority in Aristotle's Metaphysics, Oxford University Press, 2011, 352pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199588350.

Reviewed by Charlotte Witt, University of New Hampshire


In this highly ambitious monograph, Michail Peramatzis undertakes two daunting projects. The first is to develop an interpretation of Aristotle's notion of priority that "renders his view philosophically attractive." (p. 2) In particular, Peramatzis wants to develop an interpretation of priority that is adequate to the full range of Aristotle's examples, and does not employ ad hoc devices to make the concept fit the examples. The second task is to present Aristotle's notion of priority in a manner that shows it to constitute "a viable unified account of the different concepts of priority employed by modern metaphysicians." (p. 3) As a consequence of the second goal the book moves very freely between claims about the interpretation of Aristotle's texts and ideas about ontological priority and ontological dependence as these terms are used in contemporary metaphysics. The Introduction is a case in point. Peramatzis begins with a discussion of Quine and Aristotle and their different approaches to ontology and ends with a comparison of Aristotle's method with that of John Correia, a contemporary metaphysician writing on the notion of priority. Sandwiched in between the two is an outline of some of Peramatzis' complex and subtle interpretations of Aristotle's notion of priority.

After reading the Introduction, this reviewer wondered about the book's intended audience. It is difficult to imagine many Aristotle scholars who are interested in vetting Aristotle's metaphysics for contemporary consumption, but it is even harder to conceive of a contemporary metaphysician who would be willing (or able) to follow the intricate task of deciphering Aristotle's texts. Still, for those Aristotle scholars and contemporary metaphysicians with the requisite interests and skills, Priority in Aristotle's Metaphysics is a complex and provocative interpretation of a central concept in Aristotle's metaphysics and epistemology.

Although Peramatzis begins with a list of all the various contexts in which Aristotle uses a notion of priority (including his ethical and political texts) the bulk of his book is devoted to priority in definition (Part One) and priority in being (Part Two). According to Peramatzis there is a parallel between the definitional hierarchy and the ontological one: "Schematically speaking, my interpretation introduces the idea of an ontological hierarchy every level of which corresponds to a parallel level of a coordinate definitional or conceptual hierarchy." (p. 301) Although the two hierarchies are parallel, and thus could be equally basic, Peramatzis rightly notes that -- for Aristotle -- the ontological level is more fundamental than the definitional/conceptual level. One issue facing Peramatzis' interpretation is whether it successfully identifies a sense of ontological priority that is distinct from priority in definition. I return to this issue below.

Each of the hierarchies has a central puzzle of interpretation. With regard to being, the central puzzle is how to make Aristotle's description of the ontological priority of actuality or form in relation to the composite and to matter cohere with an existential reading of the dependency relation. According to this interpretation ontological priority is existential independence: to say that A is prior to B is to say that A can exist without B but B cannot exist without A. But, Peramatzis points out, the form of a natural substance is both ontologically prior to the matter and the composite, and existentially dependent upon it. He proposes to resolve this puzzle (and others) by developing an alternative interpretation of priority in being (PIB): "A is ontologically prior to B if and only if A can be what it essentially is independently of B being what it is, while the converse is not the case" (p. 13) This interpretation of ontological priority is similar to one proposed recently by Jonathan Beere in Doing and Being: An Interpretation of Aristotle's Metaphysics Theta. (Oxford: Oxford University Press 2009)

There are several challenges facing the proposal. First, it is a real question whether Aristotle distinguished between existence and essence in the way required by Peramatzis' interpretation of ontological priority. So, it might be the case that -- for Aristotle -- x existing and x being what it is -- are inseparable in a way that undercuts the proposed interpretation which pre-supposes a sharp distinction. Peramatzis acknowledges that Aristotle does not draw a distinction between being as existence and being as essence in the Metaphysics where we might expect him to do so (including in the text containing the definition of ontological priority). And so his interpretation rests on the claim that the interpretation of ontological priority as essential priority (PIB) is the only way or the best way to make sense of Aristotle's examples and distinctions. (p. 211) But it seems to me that without establishing that Aristotle drew a distinction between being as existence and being as essence in his metaphysics (a distinction that is clearly drawn by Aquinas in De Ente et Essentia for example) the best that can be concluded is that ontological priority in Aristotle is a mélange of existential and essential dependency relations. That is, Peramatzis might be able to establish that the "pure" existential interpretation is mistaken because more is needed to make sense of some of Aristotle's examples, but that leaves open the possibility of a "blended" interpretation.

Does Peramatzis' interpretation of ontological priority as [PIB] conflate priority in being and priority in definition? According to Peramatzis "despite the (perhaps even necessary) extensional equivalence between real definitional priority and ontological priority, the two concepts are not identical. For, I claimed, ontological priority in the sense of [PIB] grounds real definitional priority." (p. 266) Ontological priority is identity-fixing in the sense that what is ontologically prior fixes the identity of what is ontologically posterior; the ontologically prior item makes the ontologically posterior item be what it is. Peramatzis emphasizes that the causation in question is not only formal, but also "efficient, final and material-grounding causation." (p. 267) While this addition does serve to distinguish ontological priority from real definitional priority, it does so at a cost. With this addition it becomes difficult to maintain a sense of ontological priority that is devoid of existential implications. So, it seems that either Peramatzis must give up a bright line distinction between ontological priority and real definitional priority or he must admit that the identity fixing concept interpreted via Aristotle's four causes, brings an existential dimension to [PIB].

With regard to priority in definition the central question is how and in what way the definitions of natural form includes matter. Peramatzis characterizes definitional priority as follows: A is prior in definition to B just in case A is (correctly) defined without mentioning B, but B is not (correctly) defined without mentioning A. The difficulty is that natural form is prior in definition to the compound of form and matter and the matter so it should be definable independently of any mention of matter. But, since natural form is essentially enmattered, it seems that its definition must mention matter in its definition. Not surprisingly, Peramatzis proposes to distinguish two senses of matter in order to establish the claim that there is one sense of the term in which the natural forms of substances are definable independently of matter and another sense of the term in which they are not. Distinguishing two senses of matter is a commonplace in Aristotle scholarship; for example, there is the distinction between the proximate matter of the hylomorphic compound (the organic parts or functionally defined matter) and the remote matter of the compound (flesh, bones, sinews).

For Peramatzis, however, the relevant distinction is between "token-materials that constitute either a particular hylomorphic compound or the type-matters included in universal compounds" and "material features or modes of being". (p. 7) Natural forms have matter in the second sense in their definitions, but the definitions do not include mention of the matter that composes a hylomorphic individual or compound universal. The intuitive core of this interpretation focuses on the causal and explanatory functions of form, and the central idea is that natural form's priority in definition should be understood in relation to its causal and explanatory function. "Put simply, the idea is that natural form, as a hylomorphic whole made up of formal plus material features, causes token- or type-materials and particular or universal compounds to be as they are. In this way it explains their nature." (p. 178) Peramatzis' interpretation makes use of the causal-explanatory model of definition which allows him to establish an explanatory priority for form that is compatible in principle with form itself being enmattered. However, it is just not clear what "token- or type materials" are relevant here. Peramatzis settles on a deflationary view that simply identifies the matter as whatever is an instantiation of the relevant form.

Finally, it seems as though natural form, as a hylomorphic whole would itself turn out to be a hylomorphic individual. In response to this problem Peramatzis develops the view that although form is essentially enmattered, the parts in question, the form and matter are themselves aspectual or "weak" parts. "A form's essential formal and material weak parts are merely its aspects, i.e. separately incomplete features or mutually interdependent modes of being included in it". (p. 305) The idea that form is itself enmattered essentially leads us to wonder about its ontological status. But it did not seem to this reader that the notion of weak or aspectual parts did much to clear up the mystery. One standard interpretation of hylomorphic substance in Aristotle is that the substance is the concrete individual and its form and matter are simply aspects of it. This suggests that characterizing form and matter as aspects (or weak parts incapable of separate existence) is entirely compatible with the idea that what they are aspects of is a concrete individual. So, in the end the ontological character of natural form is left unclear, and Peramatzis' characterization of the way in which form and matter are essentially intermingled in natural form does not indicate an easy resolution to this issue.

The topic of priority in Aristotle's philosophy has not received the scholarly attention it deserves. Priority in Aristotle's Metaphysics is a complex, detailed contribution to the scholarly literature that will help to focus attention on the topic. While I am not convinced by all of the interpretations Peramatzis offers -- indeed I am not sure I understand them all -- his scope is admirably wide and philosophically ambitious.