Private Government: How Employers Rule Our Lives (and Why We Don't Talk about It)

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Elizabeth Anderson, Private Government: How Employers Rule Our Lives (and Why We Don't Talk about It), Princeton University Press, 2017, xxviii + 196pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780691176512.

Reviewed by Wayne Norman, Duke University


The pumping heart of this little volume is furnished by Elizabeth Anderson's two (already-published) Tanner Lectures, delivered at Princeton in 2015. Complementing the broad and transdisciplinary subject matter of Anderson's lectures are chapter-length commentaries from the historian of modern England, Ann Hughes; the literary theorist and historian of ideas, David Bromwich; the political philosopher, Niko Kolodny; and the political economist and small businessperson, Tyler Cowen. The two lectures are preceded by Stephen Macedo's introduction, which surveys the entire discussion. And the volume concludes with Anderson's lengthy reply to her commentators.

The three-part title highlights the three interrelated objectives Anderson stakes out for this bold essay. The first part of the subtitle, "How Employers Rule Our Lives," identifies the neglected normative issue she is prodding her readers to take seriously. (She concedes that her readers will be mostly political philosophers, or students aspiring to be, but she writes in a style that could engage any educated reader interested in problems of social justice. The entire book could work equally well, albeit in different ways, in a freshman or a graduate seminar.) Through dozens of quick examples of oppressive, yet perfectly legal, managerial practices, Anderson unveils what she considers to be the pervasive "authoritarian governance in our work and off-hours lives" by corporate America in the twenty-first century. She reckons that a quarter of employees already "understand that they are subject to dictatorship at work." Another 55 percent,

who are neither securely self-employed nor upper-level managers . . . [are] only one arbitrary and oppressive managerial decision away from realizing what the 25 percent already know. But this 80 percent receives almost no recognition in contemporary public and academic discourse. (63)

The pithy title itself, Private Government, indicates Anderson's radical proposal for how workplace oppression and subordination should be framed and conceptualized -- namely, by treating corporate governance structures as a form of private (we might say "privatized") government. Of course, questions about the legitimacy of authority; the justice of government-determined privileges and rights; freedom and coercion; and the role of the governed in decisions about and by the governors, are all core concerns in political philosophy. It follows, then, that the critique and reform of private government should be right in the political philosopher's wheelhouse. Political philosophers should be bothered by the fact that "private governments impose controls on workers that are unconstitutional for democratic states to impose on citizens who are not convicts or in the military." (63)

The third part of the title -- the sub-subtitle in parentheses "And Why We Don't Talk About It" -- signals the task that will preoccupy Anderson for the lion's share of her essay. As she has done throughout her career, Anderson aims to blow up what she sees as her scholarly community's blinkered agenda of core problems and its misconceived core concepts. And to do this she needs to explain why something so apparently obvious has managed to go unnoticed by most mainstream scholars in the tradition for as long as anyone can remember. Anderson will weave such an "error theory" from several distinct strands. Much of the first lecture revisits English and American social history before and after the Industrial Revolution, along with a fresh rereading of some of the key contemporary texts in political economy from Adam Smith, Thomas Paine, Karl Marx and others. For this was a period, Anderson argues, when transforming the conditions of working life was considered to be a necessary step toward realizing political ideals of freedom and equality. She also engages explicitly in ideological critique, notably of libertarian and Cold War influences on academic and public perceptions. And she defends philosophically the reconceptualization of her two-word title. As she puts it in the Reply to Commentators, "The main point I have argued in these lectures is that the problem of workplace governance needs to be put on the table for what it is: a problem of government, not of markets or 'freedom of contract'" (131).

How does one go about getting a largely-ignored problem "put on the table for what it is"? There are a few famous examples of great philosophers being awoken from dogmatic slumbers, scales falling from eyes, upon exposure to a clever and seemingly irrefutable argument (to recall Kant's and Bentham's recollections of reading Hume). But tight philosophical arguments are unlikely, on their own, to shake up a calcified agenda reflecting what the gatekeepers of an academic field's journals consider to be the problems that really matter. Topics and approaches typically become hot for unpredictable reasons, and path-dependence ensures they will stay hot, or at least warm, long after they have ceased to be interesting. Once-vital debates are more likely simply to die of exhaustion than to be killed decisively by an argument for their irrelevance. It is even rarer that a scholarly community is convinced by way of a long and careful scholarly argument that it has been blind to a large quadrant of its legitimate problem space; especially when rectifying this neglect would require philosophers to bone up on historical and contemporary facts, and to skill up on sophisticated theories from law, economics, sociology, and psychology (all of which are indispensible for understanding the dynamics and reform of organizational cultures and governance structures).

As a case in point, consider how little impact on the field some philosophically respectable works on Anderson's very topic have had so far. The philosopher Christopher McMahon has published two books -- Authority and Democracy: A General Theory of Government and Management (Princeton University Press, 1994), and Public Capitalism: The Political Authority of Corporate Executives (University of Pennsylvania Press, 2013) -- that tackle exactly the problems that Anderson wants philosophers to take seriously. Yet Anderson herself seems never to have cited (or read?) either book. The opening lines of McMahon's most recent monograph announce:

In a modern capitalist society, the senior executives of large, profit-seeking corporations play an important role in shaping the collective life of the society as a whole . . . they exercise social authority . . . [which] can be legitimate only if it constitutes a form of political authority. I call the species of capitalism that results public capitalism.

"Public capitalism" and "private government" are two sides of the same coin, a currency that is necessary once we reject the widely presupposed but artificial distinction between "public government" and "private capitalism."

Where McMahon tried to gently awaken colleagues from dogmatic slumbers with careful, comprehensive, and appropriately sympathetic scholarly argument, Anderson sets about to inspire and energize those who are ready to be woke. Compare how they introduce their common problem. Here are the first lines of McMahon's first book:

This book is an essay in political philosophy. It depicts government and management as two components of an integrated system of social authority that is essentially political in nature . . . the principle goal is to determine when the democratic exercise of authority, both in government and in nongovernmental organizations, is appropriate. (McMahon 1994: 3)

And here is how Anderson chooses to introduce that problem in the lecture entitled "Private Government," in the opening section labeled "Communist Dictatorships in Our Midst":

Imagine a government that assigns almost everyone a superior whom they must obey. Although superiors give most inferiors a routine to follow, there is no rule of law. Orders may be arbitrary and can change any time, without prior notice or opportunity to appeal. Superiors are unaccountable to those they order around. They are neither elected nor removable by their inferiors. Inferiors have no right to complain in court . . . except in a few narrowly defined cases . . . The most highly ranked individual takes no orders but issues many. The lowest-ranked may have their bodily movements and speech minutely regulated for most of the day . . . This government does not recognize a personal or private sphere of autonomy free from sanction. It may prescribe a dress code and forbid certain hairstyles. Everyone lives under surveillance . . . Suspicious searches of their bodies and personal effects may be routine . . . The government may dictate the language spoken . . . It may forbid certain topics of discussion. People can be sanctioned for their consensual sexual activity or for their choice of spouse . . . They can be sanctioned for their political activity and required to engage in political activity they do not agree with.

The economic system of the society run by this government is communist. The government owns all the nonlabor means of production in the society it governs . . . The vast majority have no realistic option but to try to immigrate to another communist dictatorship . . . (37-38)

It continues like this for two full pages until the revelation we already know is coming: that most people in the United States "work under just such a government: it is the modern workplace . . . Most workers in the United States are governed by communist dictatorships in their work lives." (39) Exquisite academic trolling! It is lobbed toward those who assume that only governments, but not markets or private citizens, can constrain liberty; "a view widely accepted in public discourse, certainly among libertarians, but not only among them." (42)

Anderson is an equal-opportunity revisionist provocateuse. How many on the left, for example, have ever thought that "The ideal of a free market society used to be a cause of the left"? (1) Or that Adam Smith was one of "the left's" great theoreticians? "On Smith's account, the rise of commerce and manufacturing led people to leave the lords' estates to become artisans and tradesmen" liberating them from "servile dependency." (19-20) "Smith believed that in a fully free market, the commercial and manufacturing sectors would . . . be dominated by small-scale enterprises, run by independent artisans and merchants, with at most a few employees." (21) American "egalitarians" from Paine to Lincoln, developed a similar vision of "a free market economy in which nearly everyone either is self-employed . . . or working in a small firm with high and rising wages . . . so that one could purchase one's own farm or workshop after a few years." (22-3) Anderson invites us to imagine such a world, in which everyone "would meet on an equal footing with everyone else. All would enjoy personal independence. No one would be subject to another's domination. Would this not be close to an egalitarian utopia, a truly free society?" (23)

It would have been. It almost was. But it is no longer possible. The Industrial Revolution killed it (33). Smith underestimated economies of scale. His butcher is now working the night shift on the line in an industrial meatpacking plant. The socialist experiments in the nineteenth century "either failed, were denied a real trial, or never managed to scale up." (6) As for those that were tested in the twentieth century, Anderson has "no space to recount the follies of democratic state socialism . . . [or] the catastrophes of state communism." (62) She does support a strong role for organized labor as a check on the wildly asymmetrical power imbalance within corporate dictatorships, and she briefly indicates ways industrial relations in America might be improved (e.g., by learning from Western Europe). But she does not pretend to "offer a blueprint for a better constitution of a workplace government." (xxii, also 70).

Her subtitle is How Employers Rule Our Lives (and Why We Don't Talk about It), not, as is more typical of books sold in airport bookstores, something like . . . (and What We Should Do about It) or . . . (and How to Fight Back!). We don't talk about this problem because we don't see it. And we don't see it because of ideology. This is why her "focus in both lectures is on ideology." (xx) She is talking about ideologies in a non-pejorative sense: abstract models that help us "to represent and cope with the social world . . . disregarding many of its features . . . " so that we can "identify the normatively important features of the world . . . We can hardly do without them." (xx-xxi) But of course our ideologies can also "mask problematic features of our world . . . or lack the normative concepts needed to identify what is problematic about them . . ." (xxi) Most of her revisionist rereading of history and the history of thought, along with the trolling of libertarians and a few 1970s-era economic theorists of the firm, is aimed at ripping away these ideological masks. Her retooling of the so-called public-private distinction (43-6), and her conception of government as something that "exists wherever some have the authority to issue orders to others, backed by sanctions, in one or more domains of life" (42), are the normative concepts the freshly unmasked can use to reflect on the fraught nature of organizational life.

So what do her eminent commentators think of all this? If I may be a little unfair, in part due to lack of space here: they kind of don't get it. Although Anderson signposts her revisionist, ideological mission clearly in several places, the commentators cleave to the expertise that got them invited to respond. So the historians find numerous omissions and insufficient balance and nuance in her sweeping historical narrative that runs from the English to the American civil wars. They cannot help pointing out her cherry-picking of passages from the canonical texts. The philosopher remains unpersuaded by her persuasive redefinitions of central political concepts like "government," and dubious of the fruitfulness of reframing the problems of organizational life in terms of governments and their subjects or citizens -- especially if we hope to incorporate ideals of democracy. The economist wonders why the author did not entertain any of the abundant non-anecdotal empirical evidence for believing that most employees do not feel especially oppressed, and would probably not welcome some of the reforms to their workplace that might be entailed by her critique. Most of the specific criticisms in these four commentaries strike me as accurate and fair. But, oddly, I was also just as impressed with the author's spirited replies. It's less important that she gets the history right than it is that she shows how misleading her ideological rivals' accounts are. We can choose to judge the success of this essay more on the basis of what it claims to be doing, and less on the accuracy, nuance, or scholarly fairness of its specific critiques. Anderson succeeds because her objective was to show that these topics are worthy of searching political and philosophical debate, and her interlocutors took up that challenge enthusiastically. To be sure, this is not the genre of polemical prose we want to find in PhD dissertations in philosophy or political science departments. But why should we want our leading philosophers to be confined in all settings to that particularly stuffy mode of communication?

Anderson writes as if she were unaware of a burgeoning literature by political philosophers and theorists on her topic. But readers inspired by her questions can turn immediately to a variety of very recent approaches to framing and answering such questions in, e.g., Joseph Heath's Morality, Competition, and the Firm (OUP 2014), Abraham Singer's The Form of the Firm (OUP 2018), David Ciepley's "Beyond Public and Private: Toward a Political Theory of the Corporation," American Political Science Review 101/1 (2013), and Sandrine Blanc's "Expanding Workers' 'Moral Space': a Liberal Critique of Corporate Capitalism," J. of Business Ethics, 120/4 (2014). Political philosophers have been discussing foundational issues for corporate governance, organizational justice, and employee rights on the pages of business ethics journals for decades. (See Jeffrey Moriarty's entry on "Business Ethics" in the Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy for a state-of-the-art entrée to this literature.) Perhaps Anderson's swagger and bravura will embolden those participating in these heretofore "fringe" debates to seek and demand their proper audience within the more mainstream venues of political philosophy.