Private Wrongs

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Arthur Ripstein, Private Wrongs, Harvard University Press, 2016, 313pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674659803.

Reviewed by Lewis A. Kornhauser, New York University


The last twenty-five years (starting perhaps with Ernest Weinrib (1995)) have seen a renaissance in private law theory in general and in tort theory in particular. Prior to the renaissance, the instrumental approach of economic analysis dominated private law theory. In response, contract and tort theorists have adumbrated an increasing variety of non-instrumental accounts of contract and tort.

Arthur Ripstein's book is a signal contribution to this growing literature. It is both clearly written and densely argued. The book repays careful reading.  In the first chapter, Ripstein frames the enterprise and then develops his own theory of tort as a private wrong. The chief antagonists in the first chapter are instrumentalists, primarily in their incarnation as economic analysts of law, among whom I number. As a consequence, though the book taught me much about private law theories generally and tort law, I find Ripstein's framing of the question problematic. Some of my perplexity applies generally to non-instrumental theories but some of it bears on Ripstein's theory directly. To begin, however, I shall briefly summarize the long argument of the book and then turn to the framing of the issue.

Unlike corrective justice theorists, Ripstein focuses on the private rights and duties that give rise to the cause of action rather than the duty to remedy. His theory offers a unified account of tort causes of action that derives from the idea that moral agents have a right to pursue their purposes independently. In Ripstein's words, agents are "in charge of" the means that they have to pursue their purposes. The agent's means consist of his or her body and his or her property.

In chapter 2 Ripstein develops his conception of being "in charge of" and then argues that the agent's rights to use his or her means to pursue her projects gives rise to two classes of wrongdoing that correspond to two classes of injuries and hence of causes of action. Battery and trespass characterize the first class of wrongs; they are grounded, on Ripstein's account, in the tortfeasor's misuse of the agent's body and property respectively; they are, in his terminology, use-based wrongs. Auto accidents exemplify the second class of wrongs in which the tortfeasor "wrongfully" damages the agent's body or property. Ripstein calls these torts "damage-based wrongs."

Chapter 3 distinguishes misfeasance and nonfeasance. Ripstein elaborates this distinction in light of his guiding idea that an individual has rights to use her own means. Misfeasance gives rise to private wrongs but nonfeasance does not; misfeasance uses or damages the individual's body or property while nonfeasance does not give rise to causes of action because such causes of action would interfere with the defendant's right to use her means for her purposes.

Chapter 4 analyzes negligence which structures damage-based torts. This chapter sets the stage for Ripstein's analysis of strict liability in chapter 5 where he argues that wrong-doing still remains the gravamen of the action. Both these chapters offer rich and illuminating accounts of the underlying doctrines.

Chapter 6 addresses torts that arise from actions that are permissible unless undertaken with improper intent. Chapter 7 provides an interesting analysis of the law of defamation, a set of doctrines that lie outside the wrongs to body and property that have motivated the prior analysis.

Chapters 8 and 9 examine remedy and the role of courts in tort. Ripstein argues that the idea that the remedy "makes the plaintiff whole" is often misinterpreted as repairing the damage caused; rather, on Ripstein's account, the remedy restores the integrity of the right violated by the tortfeasor's wrong. Chapter 9 elucidates the essential role of the court as the impersonal arbiter of the dispute that avoids the use of an agent's means that even a self-help remedy violates.[1]

Though the book is very carefully argued, it leaves several important questions unaddressed. The largest gap in the argument concerns the choice of material to be explained. This failure is one shared by the literature generally. Some of the following concerns are thus not specific to Ripstein's argument but others address specific choices that Ripstein has made.

Here is the basic question: which materials form a coherent whole that require or merit a unified explanation? This question has a jurisdictional, doctrinal, and material component. Ronald Dworkin (1986) answers all three components of this question in a clearly defensible manner; he require his judge Hercules to rationalize all the legal materials in a specified jurisdiction where legal materials are the past political decisions of the community, i.e., the constitution, statutes, regulations, and case decisions. The key feature of case decisions for Dworkin is the disposition; explaining the reasoning of the court is less important. This view of the task corresponds to the judge's, and lawyer's, task of resolving a dispute according to the law of her jurisdiction. It also suggests a practice of seriatim opinions, as in England, where no opinion of the court exists so that, in a certain sense, there are no official statements of doctrine by courts. Only individual judges and lawyers explicitly articulate doctrine.

Ripstein answers each of these questions differently. Consider the jurisdictional component first. Private Wrongs is intended as a cross-jurisdictional theory of common law torts generally. Unfortunately it is difficult to understand exactly what this means. Presumably, Ripstein relies on the similarity of the broad outlines of tort law across jurisdictions. But variation across jurisdictions in specific doctrines renders it difficult for us to assess the quality of the explanation. Further, though Ripstein claims that his approach attends to the reasoning of courts, judicial reasoning is specific to the jurisdiction in which the court sits. It is thus hard to understand how an abstract discussion of tort law respects the process of common law reasoning.

Turn now to the doctrinal component. Ripstein and private law theorists generally have taken doctrinal divisions seriously. They have largely adopted the course divisions of the classical first-year curriculum in common law jurisdictions. We thus have tort theory, contract theory and property theory. It may be that these doctrinal divisions reflect distinct moral domains with distinct conceptual structures and principles. Or they may simply be an artifact of the ancient system of English writs that gave rise to the common law with tort evolving from the writs of trespass and of trespass on the case. Or perhaps the law of tort and contract constitute a unified body of law as the civil law tradition suggests.

Even accepting the doctrinal divisions of the curriculum, Ripstein does not address every doctrine covered in a torts class or casebook. Nor is such comprehensive coverage necessary. He seeks only to illuminate the general structure of tort law through the analysis of paradigmatic torts. Nonetheless, a successful argument must not omit discussion of a significant doctrine that apparently runs counter to his thesis. Ripstein says nothing about one of the most significant developments of twentieth century tort law: product liability. Over roughly half a century, common law courts moved the treatment of injuries arising from defective products from the contract casebooks to the torts casebooks. On many accounts, these legal developments responded to changes in the structure of production and marketing in industrial societies. The development thus apparently has an instrumental aspect that Ripstein's account wants to deny. Moreover, strict liability better characterizes the regime of product liability than negligence even though, on Ripstein's account, injuries from defective products are damage-based, not use-based, wrongs.

Turn finally to the material component. Once one has determined which cases or doctrines in which jurisdiction(s) constitute the subject of inquiry, the analyst confronts a third question. Which aspects of the decisions must the analyst explain? The instrumentalists and the non-instrumentalists divide on this question. Jody Kraus (2007) suggests that economic analysts of law seek to rationalize the pattern of case dispositions while the non-instrumentalists seek to rationalize both the dispositions and the reasoning of the case. Indeed, the non-instrumentalists think the structure of the litigation as "bipolar" is a central element that any explanation of private law must explain.

Ripstein phrases this last requirement as respecting "the fact that the court is addressing a dispute between two private parties and asks only about whether the plaintiff currently before the court is entitled to a remedy from the defendant currently before the court." (p. 4) Bipolarity, however, typifies public law as well as private law adjudication. Antitrust law grants standing to "direct purchasers" (and state attorneys general) to challenge anti-competitive practices; employment discrimination law similarly grants employees standing to challenge the anti-discriminatory practices of their employers.

These examples raise two difficulties for the non-instrumentalist theories that rely on their ability to provide an "essential" explanation for bipolarity. First, both antitrust law and employment discrimination law are instrumental they are nonetheless compatible with a bipolar structure in the adjudication of the rights created by the statutory scheme. Moreover, it might be sensible, as various theories of statutory interpretation hold, for judicial interpretations of the statutory scheme to rely in part on the specific language and details of the statute rather than on the statute's purpose or function. The bipolar structure of litigation is thus compatible with instrumentalist accounts of law.

Second, bipolarity is on some accounts a general feature of adjudication not a feature of private law adjudication only. "The Forms and Limits of Adjudication" (Lon Fuller 1978), for instance, identifies bipolarity as the central feature of adjudication.[2] But, if bipolarity is a general feature of adjudication, why would the justification of bipolarity depend on the substance of the claim rather than on the institutional design and competence of the judiciary? A more general justification of bipolarity undermines the claim of non-instrumental theorists that bipolarity is an essential feature of private law that requires justification.

Consider now a second difficulty in the structure of Ripstein's argument. Prevailing tort law plays a distinctive role in his argument. On his account, though tort law instantiates the moral idea of independence, "the law . . . appear[s] as an exporter rather than an importer of those [moral] ideas." (p. 21) Legal doctrine thus serves as a normative baseline.  It is unclear, however, how doctrine can perform this function. At least in the context of wrongs to property, the legal rule itself determines the content of the property right. Trespass to land, for instance, requires a "wrongful" interference with an agent's interest in land. But the tort rule itself determines the structure of the agent's property right. One requires an independent ground to determine the baseline property right.

These critical comments reflect the perplexity of someone who considers private law from a radically different perspective. They should not, however, detract from the achievement of Ripstein's book which, even for instrumentalists, illuminates both the structure of private law theory and of tort law.


Chayes, Abraham. (1976), "The Role of the Judge in Public Law Litigation," Harvard Law Review, 89(7), 1281-1316.

Dworkin, Ronald M. (1986), Law's Empire, Harvard University Press.

Fuller, Lon. (1978), "The Forms and Limits of Adjudication," Harvard Law Review, 92(2), 353-409.

Gold, Andrew S. (forthcoming), "Private Rights and Wrongs," Michigan Law Review.

Kraus, Jody. (2007), "Philosophy of Contract Law," in Jules Coleman and Scott Shapiro (eds.), The Oxford Handbook of Jurisprudence and Philosophy of Law, Oxford University Press, 687-751.

Weinrib, Ernest (1995), The Idea of Private Law, Oxford University Press.

[1] Andrew Gold (forthcoming) argues that Ripstein's account ignores the substantial role that self-help remedies play in the law of tort.

[2] Abraham Chayes (1976) argues that bipolarity did not typify much of the innovative public law litigation in federal trial courts at the time. The courts, however, have retreated from the activist reform litigation of that era.