Probabilistic Knowledge

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Sarah Moss, Probabilistic Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2018, 268pp., $54.00  (hbk), ISBN 9780198792154.

Reviewed by Kenny Easwaran, Texas A&M University


This is a work in epistemology focused on the issues of contextualism and pragmatic encroachment. This is also a work in philosophy of language focused on the semantics of epistemic modals and indicative conditionals. On Moss's view, many problems in all four of these areas can be addressed if we dethrone the "proposition" as the supposed object of belief, assertion, and knowledge, and replace it instead with "probabilistic content". While there are connections to issues in formal epistemology (and formal epistemologists will certainly want to read at least a few sections of this book, if not the whole thing), it is knowledge and language that take center stage.

A "probabilistic content", for Moss, is a set of probability spaces. Each space in the set has its own set of worlds, and a probability function defined over those worlds. Importantly, these probability functions do not represent any objective probability function like chances or evidential probabilities, and they don't even quite represent the subjective probabilities of the Bayesian. They are just abstract mathematical entities. This is a device for theoretical representation, not something that believers or speakers themselves need to grasp.

On a more familiar view, the objects of belief, assertion, and knowledge are propositions, which we might think of as sets of worlds, or perhaps somewhat more structured entities composed of objects and properties or Fregean senses. For Moss, these sets of worlds are still the inputs to the probability function, but we need the richer structure of a set of probability spaces to adequately capture the contents of beliefs, assertions, and knowledge.

In simple cases, where one believes that there is life on Mars, or asserts that Paris is the largest city in Europe, or knows that there was a major extinction event at the end of the Permian, the probabilistic content is much like the proposition consisting of the set of worlds that satisfy the relevant sentence. But instead of being a single set of worlds, it includes every probability function that is defined only over worlds in this set. Such a content is said to be "nominally probabilistic" as opposed to the more "thoroughly probabilistic" contents involved in the belief that there is more likely life on Mars than on Mercury, or the assertion that Paris is probably the largest city in Europe, or the knowledge that the end-Permian extinction might have been caused by massive floods of lava. These contents include probability functions over many different sets of worlds, as long as they assign higher probability to life on Mars than to life on Mercury, or higher probability to Paris being the largest city in Europe than not, or non-zero probability to the end-Permian extinction being caused by floods of lava. The relationship between a nominally probabilistic content and the corresponding set of worlds on her view is analogous to the relationship between a singleton set containing one world and the corresponding world on the more familiar view.

The book has three major parts. Chapters 1-4 make the case that belief and assertion have probabilistic contents. Chapters 5-7 defend the more contentious thesis that knowledge does as well. Chapters 8-10 draw out implications of probabilistic knowledge for many issues in epistemology. Although the positive cases are made in chapters 1, 2, and 5, I think that the thesis is best understood through many of its implications in the other chapters. And one feature of this book that I found extremely helpful is that one really can skip right to the parts one is interested in.

The book is structured to be usable by potential readers with many different interests. The preface describes several abridged reads, from the paper-length version (sections 1.1, 1.2, 2.2, 5.6, 5.8, 6.2, 6.3) to the half-reads a single-minded epistemologist or philosopher of language might do. Each chapter or section makes clear what it is about, and how to find the relevant parts for your purpose. More books should be designed this way.

The central claim in the first chapter is that it is better to theorize the doxastic state of an agent with a single attitude (belief) to complex contents (these sets of probability spaces) than to theorize with many complex attitudes (finding p likely, finding p more likely than q, finding p equally likely as q conditional on r, etc.) to simple contents (propositions). I became convinced of this claim once I realized that this doesn't have to be taken as a claim about the metaphysics of belief -- one doesn't need to think there is a belief box, into which one can slot some representation of sets of probability spaces. Instead, this thesis is just about the theory that is needed to make sense of our language (with its conditionals, modals, and even nested modals) and the concept of knowledge (with all the complexities that have led epistemologists to versions of contextualism and pragmatic encroachment).

A Bayesian can say that there is some level at which an agent's doxastic state consists of a probability space, consisting of a set of doxastically possible worlds with a probability function over them. (In chapter 8 Moss suggests that imprecise credences might be better, but I will stick with the precise version to keep things simple.) To believe a probabilistic content, then, just is for this probability space to be contained in that set. (This is analogous to the toy model one might associate with Stalnakerian accounts of belief -- the doxastic state is just a set of worlds, and one believes a proposition iff one's doxastic state is a subset of that proposition.) The Bayesian should already admit that this probability space is not the most fundamental description of the doxastic state -- there is no challenge to the Bayesian if we open up the brain and find no explicit representation of propositions and numerical probabilities associated with them. One can conceive of a Bayesian artificial intelligence that does contain such representation, but Bayesianism about humans is not hostage to that sort of empirical discovery. There is some empirical content, which requires that our minds are constituted by bodies that interact in particular ways with their environment, that humans certainly approximate better than rocks do, and ravens better than sunflowers. But at whatever theoretical level the Bayesian postulates a probability function, Moss postulates attitudes and contents one level up. The attitudes and contents are not parts of the probability space -- instead the probability space is part of the contents.

In chapters 3 and 4 (and in greater detail in the appendix) she shows that this theoretical device improves our account of nested epistemic modals, and epistemic modals within conditionals. "A large terrorist organization might be more likely to use reactor-grade plutonium." "If there might be snipers in the trees, then you should use your flamethrower." In chapters 8, 9, and 10, she shows that it also gives a better account of various principles connecting knowledge to belief, action, and interpersonal relations. One can know the restaurant is probably to the left, without knowing for sure that it is to the left, and this knowledge can ground the irrationality of walking to the right, even though no ordinary propositional knowledge is available to ground this.

But this example leads to the biggest worry about probabilistic knowledge. Ordinarily, we think of knowledge as factive, so that one can't know that p unless it is true that p. But the restaurant either is to the left or to the right -- in what sense can it be true that it is probably to the left? Chapter 6 addresses this central worry. We do say that it is true that the Earth's average temperature will probably rise by at least 1°C in the next century, and false that it will probably rise by at least 10°C in the next century, even though there is also some precise degree of rise (which might be outside this range) that is true. But she argues that no other account of these claims in terms of objective probabilities will work. She ends up ensuring factivity by means of a sort of expressivism, which many semanticists already want for epistemic modals generally.

Conversely, this account also raises worries for belief or knowledge of simple claims, like my knowledge that Paris is the largest city in Europe. On her account, strictly speaking, I can only believe or know that Paris is the largest city in Europe if my credal state is a probability space that includes no possibility on which London is larger than Paris. Even though I looked up this fact in several sources while writing this review, the numbers are close enough that one might worry about whether I really can eliminate all such possibilities. Rather than following David Lewis or other contextualists in specifying some range of alternatives that need to be eliminated, in sections 3.5 and 3.6 Moss argues that our ordinary assertions about belief and knowledge are a kind of "loose speech". When we say that the meeting starts "at precisely 3:00" or that you should cook your fudge "at exactly 234°F" we mean to convey that the truth is sufficiently close to this time or temperature for present purposes. "Precisely" and "exactly" are "slack regulators" that convey that present purposes are stricter than we usually require, but still don't convey precision to the microsecond or millidegree. (Importantly, Moss notes that there are no slack regulators that loosen this connection -- words like "approximately" actually change the content itself, rather than changing how close the truth has to be to the content to count.)

Similarly, when you say that I believe or know that Paris is the largest city in Europe, you convey that my credal state is in a probabilistic content that is, for present purposes, sufficiently like the nominally probabilistic content that eliminates every single possibility where London is larger. One can tighten up this slack by saying I know for sure that Paris is the largest city in Europe, but the only ways to loosen it involve actually changing the probabilistic content, by saying that I know that Paris is probably the largest city in Europe. I find this "loose speech" idea to do a much better job of dealing with the phenomena of pragmatic encroachment than existing theories, and the strict probabilistic content much more appealing than the Lockean thesis or other theses about the connection between credence and belief.

Chapter 10 applies the theory to give an account of various cases of "moral encroachment" that have been discussed in recent years by philosophers like Rima Basu, Renee Jorgensen Bolinger, Lara Buchak, and Jessie Munton, as well as issues of legal evidence that have been discussed by L. Jonathan Cohen and David Enoch. In all of these cases, we find it somehow problematic to make certain judgments about a person merely on the basis of statistical information about a group of which they are a part. Moss shows how her view can account for these cases. In order for her semantics to work for nested modals, Moss requires a contextually supplied parameter consisting of a partition of the set of possible worlds. (I think that figuring out how this parameter is specified is the most troubling open question for her theory.) She argues that some ways of specifying this parameter make it correct to say that someone knows or believes something merely on statistical evidence, but other ways of specifying it make this incorrect. She argues that rather than purely moral or purely epistemic norms explaining these cases, they are ones in which a legal or moral norm requires the parameter to take a particular form. (We legally or morally ought to pay attention to the possibility that an individual behaves differently from her reference class.) Thus, it is the interaction of the legal or moral norm and the epistemic norm that explains the difference between knowing that a bird is yellow because 90% of the birds making that sound are yellow, and knowing that a person stole a seat at the rodeo because 90% of the attendees stole their seats.

The title concept of this book, probabilistic knowledge, involves a radical revision of some central ideas of epistemology. But it ends up providing a more unified account of many phenomena of recent interest. Philosophers with an interest in the formal semantics of conditionals or epistemic modals, and epistemologists working on contextualism or the interaction of credence and belief, should probably read most or all of this book. And many other philosophers should also find a copy and do at least some abbreviated read of parts of this book.