Problems at the Root of Law

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Feinberg, Joel, Problems at the Root of Law, Oxford University Press, 2002, 232pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0195155262.

Reviewed by Russ Shafer-Landau, University of Wisconsin, Madison


This is perhaps the last published work we will have from Joel Feinberg. It represents a fitting capstone to a very illustrious philosophical career.

Feinberg is undoubtedly one of the preeminent social and legal philosophers of the twentieth century. His work is justly praised for an enviable variety of virtues, all of which are on display in this collection of essays. He writes wonderfully well, in a lucid fashion, with a minimum of jargon. He is one of those philosophers whose aim is to utilize and preserve, so far as possible, the distinctions latent in moral common sense. He tackles central problems, as well as many of the more “applied” issues (here, entrapment, punishment for failed attempts, and funding for the arts) that capture the public’s fancy. The range of sources he relies on is remarkable–history, fiction, poetry, current news magazines and legal opinions, in addition to the usual professional philosophical suspects. These are all introduced with a light touch, dropped in at just the right spot to seal a point or helpfully illustrate a problem or view under scrutiny.

Two other features of all of Feinberg’s work are amply illustrated here. The first is his love of classification. In the longest essay in the book (“Evil”), at just under 70 pages, we are introduced to the titular theme by way of a series of distinctions among the varieties of evil. One can almost sense Feinberg’s mounting joy at parsing this domain, despite the ultimate intractability (for Feinberg) of some of the philosophical conundrums it raises. Feinberg’s attention to subtle distinctions and taxonomical niceties is directly related, I believe, to the second of the perennial features on display in the present book–the rejection of top-down theorizing, and its replacement by a very nuanced deployment of mid-level, prima facie principles. Feinberg is more content here than in earlier works to identify problems that he does not or cannot decisively solve. Some of these are ones that he makes good headway on, without rendering a final verdict (e.g., who the victor may be in debates between natural law theorists and legal positivists–see Chapter 1). Others he judges insoluble for one reason or another (e.g., what, precisely, the difference amounts to between those who are irremediably evil and those who are nonculpably mentally ill–see Chapters 6 and 7). Still others are ones that can be solved in some ways but not others–in particular, we may know which principles are relevant in rendering particular decisions, without being able to avoid reliance on practical judgment that resists algorithmic codification.

As a lovely illustration of this last idea, consider the following passage from the book’s fourth essay, “Criminal Attempts: Equal Punishment for Failed Attempts.” Feinberg is there concerned to argue that punishment must be predicated on moral blameworthiness. Can we say, in a general manner, which factors contribute to an agent’s blameworthiness? We can. But can we say, in like manner, what weight to assign to each factor, or how to commensurate weights of different factors? We cannot:

A great number and variety of factors go into the determination, whether we are talking now of criminal sentencing guides or the moral judgments they partially incorporate. A sound if blurred insight is that the harm intended is much more important an indicator of an offender’s desert than the harm actually caused. Far more useful, however, than the concept of intentionality, are the four “culpability conditions” first proclaimed in the Model Penal Code--acting purposely, knowingly, recklessly, or negligently in regard to some harmful result. Then, of course, the concept of a motive, ruthlessly kept out of the original criminal trial, forces its way back at the sentencing stage, and contributes its flavor to the emerging blameworthiness stew. Did the offender act cruelly? spitefully? from mercenary motives? out of greed? in an emotional explosion provoked by sexual rejection? or by sexual jealousy? or through political conviction? out of mercy or compassion for another’s suffering? after forethought and deliberation? out of conscientious conviction or the determination to do at any cost to oneself what one sincerely believes to be one’s moral duty? out of sudden violent impulse as mysterious to the actor as to anyone else? And after all those questions have been answered, and provocation considered, and other types of mitigation, and diminished responsibility, and the questions they raise, now at last the more traditional justifications and excuses enter the arena with their talk of subtle coercion and mistakes, mistakes of fact and mistakes of law, defenses that undermine and defenses that affirm, defense of self and defense of others, with duress and necessity, involuntary and voluntary intoxication, insanity and short of insanity a host of neuroses and psychoses, compulsions and obsessions, and the great parade of syndromes, and on and on. There is surprisingly little disagreement about the factors that belong on this list, but much disagreement about the weight to be given different factors when they conflict. (101)

Feinberg never attempts to resolve this disagreement in a general fashion; he doesn’t seek to show that, for instance, motive is invariably more important than intention (or vice versa). Nor does Feinberg, in this volume (or anywhere else that I know of), seek to solve such difficult problems by defending or invoking a general moral theory such as Utilitarianism or Kantianism. Feinberg is a master at working close to the ground, always attentive to what we really think and the way we actually do go on in reasoning about difficult moral problems. He is as adept as anyone at identifying the various salient principles whose import must be considered when arriving at correct judgment. And he shows us how much can be accomplished with their aid, and without that of the grand moral theories that have occupied the attention of so many of his contemporaries.

A nice bonus of the present collection is that about half of its contents have not before been published. The book consists of seven essays. Portions of two of these have already appeared in print, as have two complete essays. (In one case–Feinberg’s H.L.A. Hart lecture, “In Defense of Moral Rights”– the article also appeared in his earlier collection, Freedom and Fulfillment (Princeton 1992). No mention is made of the rationale for its inclusion in this collection as well.)

The first essay focuses on natural law theory, and the role of judges who must interpret immoral laws. Feinberg uses this entry as a vehicle for testing the malleability of natural law theory, and concludes with an invented dialogue between a natural law theorist and legal positivist that is pedagogically extremely useful. (It has been excerpted in the textbook that Feinberg and Jules Coleman edit, Philosophy of Law 6ed. (Wadsworth 2000).) Feinberg does not take sides in this paper; despite comments and asides, made elsewhere in his writings, to the effect that legal positivists have the upper hand, here Feinberg is content to explore the possibilities on the natural law front. He recognizes the pull of the Austinian/Benthamian contention that immoral law may yet be valid, but does what he can on behalf of natural lawyers. As he sees it, the debate between the two camps has very little practical import as it applies to the moral duties of private citizens and jurors. Only when it comes to the moral obligations of judges might a choice make some real difference. In this context, Feinberg helpfully reviews and expands upon some work of Robert Cover’s (in his oft-cited book, Justice Accused (Yale 1975)). Feinberg seems to like the suggestion that he places in the mouth of his fictitious natural lawyer–that (i) if there are any moral principles that must form a part of human law, then they are few in number and, in content, highly abstract maxims of justice; and (ii) these are to be used to countermand the results of ordinary judicial interpretation only in cases in which such interpretation would lead to “flagrant, gross and outrageous injustice and utterly crazy, pointless unreasonableness” (35). On the theoretically crucial point, however–on whether the antecedent in (i) is satisfied–Feinberg remains mum.

Chapter 2 represents Feinberg’s defense of moral rights–rights that are conceptually prior to and independent of conventional rights of any kind. He reviews efforts by Bentham, Frey and Sumner that aim either to eliminate moral rights, or to reduce them to some species of conventional right. Along the way Feinberg argues for an important point made in earlier writings, namely, that rights are, in many cases, normatively and explanatorily prior to duties–that what often explains and grounds the fact that agents are duty-bound in some way is the fact that another agent has a right against them. These are the two central theses that Feinberg seeks to defend in this essay, and, to my mind, he is completely successful in his efforts.

After having tackled the relatively abstract issues to do with natural law and moral rights, Feinberg devotes the next three essays to more concrete moral and legal problems. The first of these, discussed in Chapter 3, is criminal entrapment. One of the central theoretical problems about entrapment cases is that an agent is there caused to voluntarily undertake some action for which he is judged morally culpable. Feinberg has already shown that such a thing is possible–in his fine piece written over three decades ago, “Causing Voluntary Actions.” One’s culpability is partly a function of the strength of one’s dispositions to resist the illicit temptation, and Feinberg introduces us to two tests of strength (63-5), which are both embedded in common sense and also, unfortunately, capable of working against one another. After that he weighs in on the topic of moral luck, and develops a theme that will be carried over to the next essay in the collection (on punishment for failed attempts). Being the object of a criminal entrapment scheme launched by government officials is in some very real sense a matter of bad luck–if one succumbs to temptation, that is. And, given the tenacity with which some government agents have pursued their quarry, it would take a principled person of unusual integrity to resist. If we follow Nagel’s account of the matter, then this would be a case of “situational luck,” of the sort that leads to the stains on the moral records of concentration camp guards and entrapment victims who, were they born in quieter times, would have escaped (anything like the same degree of) deserved moral censure.

Feinberg thus undertakes to assess Nagel’s case for moral luck, and finds it wanting. The basic problem, as Feinberg sees it, stems from Nagel’s focus on an unrepresentative kind of moral verdict–one in which an agent is judged blameable for some result. Feinberg does not deny that moral luck can enter in such cases, and properly affect the moral record of the person who suffers from it. But in the criminal law, punishment is to be predicated on blameworthiness. And blameworthiness is a function of belief, desire, motive, intention, and conduct–all things that are substantially within our control. If these factors are identical across cases, then the agents in such cases cannot differ much, if at all, in regards to blameworthiness.

What entrapment does is to determine the relative strength of a person’s disposition to commit crime. Is this the sort of knowledge that governments ought to set traps to obtain? That depends–on whether the dispositions that are being mined are those of a private or public figure. “If police have the power randomly to intervene in people’s lives just to determine whether they have wrongful predispositions, then we are all subject to a great danger from those who are supposed to be our protectors” (75). As Feinberg rightly notes, things can be even worse if such entrapment schemes are not random–as when they target members of opposition political parties. With caution, Feinberg allows that it may be more palatable to put responsible governmental officials to the test–they, after all, have sworn to uphold the law, have special responsibilities to be trustworthy, and, given their positions, are already highly prone to being tested for their honesty. “It is plausible to tell them that being subject to a special kind of scrutiny is a reasonable price to pay for their power” (76).

The next chapter focuses on criminal attempts. Feinberg’s central thesis is that the distinction between “successful” and failed attempted crimes should make no difference at all in the punishment one receives. Here he takes on the penal status quo–as defended by several fine philosophers and in Seven Bad Arguments–and maintains the point, made in the previous essay, that punishability should be predicated entirely on blameworthiness. The results of one’s faulty conduct are not within one’s control, and so should not affect one’s punishability. Those who insist on disparate sentencing for attempts and successes are confusing (among other things) the purposes of tort and criminal law. Tort law is aimed at redressing actual harm, and so must take results into account in determining how to treat offenders. Criminal law has a different aim (on the whole, that of reducing harmful conduct, which aim is best secured by punishing offenders of laws even if such offenders fail in a given case to do any actual harm). Feinberg’s main positive proposal here is to eliminate the causal element in the specification of criminal offenses. An ideal criminal code would substitute the offense of wrongful homicidal behavior (chargeable in degrees) for our present distinction between murder and attempted murder. A like arrangement would be made for other offenses.

The thematic unity of chapters 3 and 4 is punctuated by the fifth essay, on public funding for the arts. I found myself applauding not only the substantive message Feinberg sought to defend (the “not-with-my-tax-money” crowd is mistaken), but the way in which he introduced quite fundamental issues in value theory as a way of adjudicating the disputes in this area. Feinberg concedes that not every taxpayer is going to benefit, even indirectly, from such publicly funded projects as opera and ballet companies. This leads him to the question of whether something can be valuable even if it benefits no one. His answer is yes, and he gets to it by means of a very nice discussion of intrinsic and inherent value (108-120). He appreciates that the case he offers is only the beginning, and not the end, of proper discussion of these issues. In a nutshell, his claim is that certain kinds of artistic activity are worthy of being valued for what they are (quite apart from any benefits they yield). This is what it is to be intrinsically valuable, for Feinberg, and it would be “odd to admit that something is objectively worthy of being valued (esteemed, treasured, cherished) and then deny that the possession of such property is any kind of reason–or a reason of significant weight–for requiring people to protect or support it” (121).

The concluding essays are both on the nature of evil. A very short chapter 7, that only begins the historical investigation into the contemporary fusing of our moral and mental illness concepts, serves as a postscript to the longest essay in the collection. Feinberg approaches the topic of evil by focusing on a question that has long vexed him–what is the relation between moral culpability and mental illness? The short answer is that the relation, as we might have expected, is extremely complex. In fact, at the end of the day, Feinberg abandons hope that we can identify any coherent and sharp line that divides the two spheres. Moral and “psychiatric” concepts have developed in tandem over the years, and their intermingling has left us in a bad way. Teasing out the implications of our notions of evil and mental illness, Feinberg is confounded by paradox and contradiction. For instance, he traces lines of equally plausible arguments that take us to the conclusion, first, that mental illness mitigates otherwise blameable conduct, and then, second, that it aggravates such an appraisal. This discussion occurs in the context of a characteristically insightful series of investigations regarding various kinds of evil. Given space limitations here, I can’t possibly do justice to the scope of Feinberg’s explorations. I shall instead simply encourage any readers interested in the topic of evil (and aren’t we all?), and that of the relation between moral appraisability and mental health, to attend to the important work that Feinberg offers us in this essay.

For those familiar with Feinberg’s work, this latest collection is bound to invite comparisons with the three earlier collections of essays that he has published: Doing and Deserving (Princeton 1970); Rights, Justice and the Bounds of Liberty (Princeton 1980); and Freedom and Fulfillment (Princeton 1992). In my estimation the book under review does not quite measure up to the initial collection. But then, in my view, Doing and Deserving represents the best thing that Feinberg ever wrote. The novelty of its arguments, the tight focus on questions of agency and responsibility, and the charge of a youngish philosopher who knows the ground that he’s breaking–all this done in writing that is about as lovely as contemporary English philosophical writing gets; it would be hard to match or surpass such an effort. The present collection doesn’t quite manage either feat, but it bears all of the markers of the Feinberg style, and is well worth the read for those interested in the questions it raises.