Problems from Reid

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James Van Cleve, Problems from Reid, Oxford University Press, 2015, 550pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199857036.

Reviewed by Terence Cuneo, University of Vermont


I am half-tempted to write a very short review of this very long book. If you have any interest in Reid and have some time to spare, then read it. Even if you are not much interested in Reid but want a vivid example of how to write history of philosophy, then read this book. Even if you are not much interested in the history of philosophy but wonder whether you should be, then read this book. You will be treated to a discussion whose level of scholarship, quality of prose and argumentation, and sensitivity to Reid's problems (and ours) is exceptional.

Of course it's one thing to say that a book is excellent; it's another to explain why. While the first is easy, the second is not (at least in the space allotted in a review). Rather than try to identify what it is about this book that makes it so good, I'll set myself some less ambitious aims. I begin with three general observations.

The first concerns how Van Cleve approaches his topic. Those familiar with his earlier Problems from Kant (Oxford, 1999) will already have a feel for how he does the history of philosophy. His approach is not to trace historical influences upon a figure, compare that figure's views with those of other prominent figures for the sake of savoring the similarities or differences that might emerge, or to engage in the construction of a large-scale historical narrative about that figure's place in the history of philosophy. Rather, it is, first, to engage in a very close and patient reading of a figure's texts, bringing him into conversation with others with whom he was (not always explicitly) engaging. In Reid's case these include, e.g., Descartes, Locke, Hume, Berkeley, and Malebranche. And, second, Van Cleve's approach is to bring a historical figure into conversation with contemporary philosophy by identifying shared philosophical problems and their possible solutions, exploring that figure's resources for addressing these problems (and vice-versa), and sometimes explaining what he should have said (or not said) given his aims. This approach treats history of philosophy as an important element of a common philosophical enterprise extended through time, whose aim is to collectively identify and address a range of shared problems.

My second observation concerns Van Cleve's interpretation of Reid. Although there has recently been a resurgence of interest in Reid, he has not received nearly the amount of attention as other moderns, such as Hume and Kant. There are a variety of explanations for this. One is the common perception that Reid doesn't present the sort of exegetical and philosophical challenges on which historians of philosophy like to cut their teeth. Perhaps this is because Reid's work is too lucid to produce these challenges (as I've heard some say). Or perhaps it is because philosophers find work done in the common sense tradition not innovative or alluring enough to produce these challenges (as I've heard others say). Whatever the reasons might be, one of the lessons from Van Cleve's book is that Reid exegesis is hardly smooth sailing. The waters can be dark; demanding interpretational puzzles await those who want to understand what Reid says. Another lesson to glean from Van Cleve's discussion is that Reid departs from positions that you or I might designate as belonging to common sense rather more often than one might expect. That we cannot perceive colors, that all causation is agent causation, or that Meinongianism about abstracta is true, are hardly the stuff from which common sense philosophy is made!

The third observation I'll make concerns the scope of Van Cleve's book. It is considerable. In sixteen chapters and 26 appendices (which are gems in their own right), he discusses Reid's views regarding perception, the geometry of visibles, memory, personal identity, epistemology, action theory, and moral philosophy, among others. While his discussion is wide-ranging, its gravitational center is Reid's views regarding perception: nearly half the chapters are devoted to them. There is good reason for structuring the book this way: perception is the topic to which Reid devoted most of his energies in both the Inquiry and the Essays on the Intellectual Powers.

The book's scope and length present any reviewer with the challenge of doing justice to its main lines, let alone to its nuances. I'll selectively present its contents, closing with some questions about whether Reid is best read as a Meinongian about abstracta, as Van Cleve (reluctantly) maintains.

Van Cleve interprets Reid as a direct realist about perception, specifically as a presentational direct realist about perception according to which external reality is presented to us in perception. The basis for this interpretation, which is more controversial than one might think, is that Reid characterizes perception as having three elements: conception, belief, and (psychological) immediacy (12). Following William Alston and Nicholas Wolterstorff, Van Cleve understands Reidian conception to be not thinking of things under concepts but rather direct apprehension. In perception, we directly apprehend the world in the sense of having Russellian acquaintance with it. But if perception incorporates acquaintance with the world, then Reid is a presentational direct realist -- presentation (as Russell noted) simply being the flip-side of acquaintance.

In defending direct realism, Reid took himself to swim against powerful tides in philosophy according to which perception involves acquaintance with only "ideas" or sense-data. Van Cleve dedicates a chapter to Reid's attack on the so-called way of ideas. Most of his efforts are, however, directed toward unpacking Reid's positive view, addressing four challenges to Reid's version of presentational direct realism.

The first is how to formulate the view in light of skeptical challenges, such as perceptual experiences of doubled-fingers, burned-out stars, and hallucinated daggers. Fascinatingly, Reid paid scant attention to skeptical challenges of this sort even though Malebranche (among others) clearly articulates them (77). Van Cleve identifies four options available that a direct presentationalist realist might avail herself of when addressing what we might call the Malebranchean challenge: (1) disjunctivism, which maintains that hallucinations and veridical experiences have no mental factor in common; (2) propositionalism, according to which "When I have an experience as of seeing an apple, I apprehend that there is an item that is red and round and shiny; such propositional contents characterize my experience regardless of whether there is an apple present"; (297) (3) Meinongianism, which tells us that the phenomenal character of perceptual experience is conferred on it by a relation to an object that may or may not exist; and (4) adverbialism, which says that when I have a perceptual experience as of an apple, I am not experiencing any object; I am experiencing a certain way. None of these positions fits everything that Reid says. So, Van Cleve does not attribute any of them to Reid, indicating only that adverbialism might be the best way to understand Reid's positive view.

The second challenge is to make sense of what Reid says about perceiving secondary qualities, such as colors. He repeatedly states that we can perceive secondary qualities. But what he says about secondary qualities is confusing: in some passages, he intimates that they are the bases of dispositions; in others, he maintains that they are the dispositions themselves. After sifting through these texts, Van Cleve argues that Reid is probably best interpreted to hold that secondary qualities are "occult properties" or dispositions -- where a disposition is a second-order property: specifically, it is the property of having some property that causes such-and-such sensations in humans (in specified circumstances). If this is the best interpretation of Reid's position, then it follows that we do not perceive colors. For we have only what Reid calls "relative conceptions" of occult qualities or dispositions. We do not have acquaintance with them in perceptual experience.

A third challenge concerns acquired perception. In Reid's terminology, acquired perception is (roughly) that phenomenon in which, through experience and habit, an agent automatically forms the conception and belief that her immediate environment is some way upon perceiving something else. For example, upon perceiving that my spouse's car keys are lying on the counter, I automatically conceive of her and form the belief that she is home. Reid talks of acquired perception as a species of perception. Can such talk be taken at face value if Reid is a presentational direct realist? Van Cleve concludes that it cannot. By Reid's own lights, acquired perception is not perception, as acquaintance with its object is absent.

A fourth challenge facing Reid's presentational direct realism is specific to visual perception. When developing his account of visual perception, Reid argued that the visual field is governed by principles other than those found in Euclidean geometry. Reid thus found himself compelled to develop a non-Euclidean geometry -- a "geometry of visibles" -- to make sense of what occurs in visual perception. (It's been a matter of scholarly debate whether Reid has fair claim to having discovered non-Euclidean geometry before the mathematicians.) After dedicating a chapter to understanding how Reid arrives at his views about visible figure, Van Cleve turns to the question of whether Reid compromises his direct presentational realism by introducing a class of intermediary entities -- namely, visible figure -- that we perceive in visual perception.

Here Van Cleve makes three moves. The first is to distinguish visibles from visible figure. Visibles are objects such as trees and tables. Visible figure, in contrast, is a property of such objects -- "a relational property (or perhaps better, a relativized property) possessed only in relation to a point of view" (189). According to this interpretation of Reid, visibles such as quadrilaterals do not merely appear to have angles that sum to more than 360 degrees when looked at from certain points of view; they really have such properties from those points of view. The second move is to claim that an appeal to relativized properties doesn't succeed (at least if a non-Euclidean geometry of visibles is to be retained) since there would have to be non-relativized properties to explain the relativized ones. For example, suppose an ordinary triangle has an angle sum of more than 180 degrees from a point p. It follows, Van Cleve contends, there must be "a special visible triangle . . . that has more than 180 degrees, period" (192-93). The third move is to suggest that direct realists can live with this result. Van Cleve's argument for this conclusion rests on the observation that a satisfactory account of direct realism should not commit itself to the claim that perception cannot be mediated by entities that we perceive or otherwise apprehend. For it may be that we have acquaintance with objects in perception even though we perceive or otherwise apprehend intermediaries of various sorts. What matters, according to Van Cleve,

in securing direct perception is not downgrading our cognitive relation to any intermediaries, but upgrading our cognitive relation to the thing perceived. If we perceive or otherwise apprehend some intermediary along the way to perceiving a certain external object, no problem -- just so long as we do in the end achieve perception of the object (that is to say, acquaintance with it) (193; cf. also p. 96).

Without developing the point at length, Van Cleve hints at how Reid could defend an account of visual perception according to which perception is mediated by visible figure but the perceiver has direct acquaintance with the visibles (194-95).

Reid took himself to have powerful reason to develop a direct realist account of perception, viewing it as a crucial step in avoiding the type of skepticism to which he took rival views to be committed. Van Cleve is not convinced that Reid is correct about this, holding that Reid's response to skepticism plays out in the arena of not perception but epistemology. Lying at the heart of Reid's epistemology is his commitment to the claim that there are a variety of self-evident first principles of common sense on which we rely to arrive at knowledge of the world.[1] Van Cleve's central question about these principles is whether they are best thought of as principles of truth or principles of evidence.

We can think of the difference between these two interpretations as follows. Take some Reidian first principle, such as:

(A) It is a first principle that, if I am conscious that I am thinking thus and so, then I am thinking thus and so.

Van Cleve notes that this principle is ambiguous between:

(B) It is a first principle that (p) (I am conscious that p → p); and:

(C) (p) (I am conscious that p → it is a first principle that p).

(B) articulates a principle of truth. It lays down a single principle that all the deliverances of consciousness are true. (C) states a principle of evidence. It tells us that each of the deliverances of consciousness is itself a first principle, that is, a self-evident proposition from which we may derive further knowledge (326). (A clarification: Reid is probably best understood to use the term "self-evident" in this context to mean immediately evident. First principles are self-evident only in the sense that they are evident but not on the basis of support from other propositions believed or known. Among other things, this understanding of self-evidence allows Reid to be a fallibilist regarding first principles.)

While acknowledging that Reid's texts sometimes suggest the first reading and sometimes the second, Van Cleve maintains that the best interpretation is the second. For one thing, when interpreted as general principles of truth, first principles do not have a strong claim to being self-evident. The particular principles of evidence have a much better claim to this status. Second, Reid claims that first principles are such that we cannot help believing them. It is not evident that this is true of principles of truth; Descartes claimed, for example, to be able to doubt principles in the neighborhood of (B). But it is not so easy to doubt, as Descartes also admits, the vivid deliverances of a faculty such as consciousness at the moment of delivery. Third, if (B) were the correct way to understand a first principle such as (A), then presumably we would know the deliverances of consciousness by subsuming it under (B). But that is not how we know these deliverances. To know a given deliverance of consciousness such as that you are now thinking, you simply have to be in the state of thinking. Finally, if (C) is the correct understanding, then it allows Reid to establish the reliability of various of our cognitive faculties through the use of those very faculties by employing a track-record argument or a boot-strapping procedure (313). When polemicizing against Descartes, Reid sometimes seems to rule out this sort of move. Van Cleve's response is that, when Reid castigates Descartes for attempting to establish the reliability of a faculty by the very use of that faculty, he is not rejecting the employment of track-record arguments as such. Rather, Reid is rejecting the claim that we can argue for the reliability of our faculties under the requirement that our faculties do not yield knowledge unless their reliability is already known.

This last point is important for Van Cleve's purposes. For, in countenancing track-record arguments, Reid endorses epistemic externalism, which Van Cleve understands to be the position that knowledge-making factors, such as first principles, do their work regardless of whether they are themselves known. Van Cleve's view is that Reid's externalist commitments are by far the most powerful weapon in his anti-skeptical arsenal. Under Van Cleve's interpretation, Reid is an externalist who accepts dogmatism (that is, the position that there are certain things you can know without any proof) but is not committed to reliabilism. Reid's externalism has it that the "mere fact that a proposition is a deliverance of perception, memory, or consciousness suffices to make that proposition evident . . . Nothing else is necessary. In particular, it is not necessary that the subject know anything about the reliability of sense perception" (341). This is an implication of interpreting the first principles of contingent truths as principles of evidence, which Van Cleve maintains is yet another point in its favor. Of course externalism is subject to a variety of objections, including the so-called easy knowledge objection, which in one of its forms finds track-record arguments to generate knowledge far too easily. Van Cleve's reply on Reid's behalf is that according to internalist alternatives, if knowledge is to be possible, then some knowledge must be easy (352). The fact that Reidian externalism implies that some knowledge is easy is no objection against it.

The foregoing offers a glimpse of the territory that Van Cleve's discussion travels. In closing, I would like to engage with Van Cleve's interpretation of one of the most puzzling aspects of Reid's position, namely, his repeated claim that the objects of conception needn't exist. For example, Reid writes: "Conception is often employed about objects that neither do, nor did, nor will exist. This is the very nature of this faculty, that its object, though distinctly conceived may have no existence" (EIP 4.1: 311). Passages such as this have led some to suspect that Reid was a Meinongian before Meinong. Van Cleve notes that the suspicion needs to be formulated correctly. For what is ordinarily called "Meinongianism" is not in fact Meinong's own view. What we might call traditional Meinongianism holds that that are two modes of being -- being and existence: the former is enjoyed by every possible object of thought, the latter is not (perhaps it belongs only to those things that lie within the causal order). What we can call actual Meinongianism -- since it represents Meinong's actual position -- says something different. It says that some objects do not exist in any manner whatsoever, but we can nonetheless think about them and make them topics of discourse (265). Formulated correctly, the suspicion is whether Reid endorsed actual Meinongianism.

There are two important reasons to hold that Reid endorses actual Meinongianism. The first is that there are a wide swath of texts that support this reading. The second is that actual Meinongianism provides one avenue of response to the Malebranchean challenge, allowing that the objects of perception are (in some cases at least) nonexistent objects. Still, the position is very puzzling. It commits Reid to claims such as:

(D) things that do not exist have properties and stand in relations; and

(E) there are things that do not exist.

Claims such as these are sufficiently perplexing that Van Cleve holds that it's worthwhile to look for alternative interpretations of Reid. He identifies two.

The first, defended by Wolterstorff, holds that the objects of (at least some cases of) conception are, according to Reid, universals. Reid repeatedly states that universals do not exist or "really" exist. Wolterstorff suggests that when Reid says this he only means that they lie outside the causal order. Van Cleve rejects this interpretation primarily on the grounds that it is insufficiently supported by the text (275). The second interpretation, which Van Cleve admits receives virtually no support from Reid's texts, appeals to the adverbial theory of thinking according to which "when we think of a horse or of a centaur, we do not stand in the thinking-of relation to some object, but instead simply think in a certain way" (276). After wrestling with the position, Van Cleve ultimately concludes that the view is "shrouded in doubts that need to be resolved" (280).

There is, I believe, a third position that has a long and impressive pedigree, receives some textual support, and would not commit Reid to perplexing claims such as (D) and (E). The position is ontological pluralism, which (in one of its prominent forms) holds that that there are multiple existential quantifiers analogously related but ultimately irreducible to one another.

One thing to be said in favor of the pluralist reading is that Reid (following Berkeley) explicitly commits himself to a narrow understanding of the term "really exists." Speaking of geometrical objects, Reid writes:

If now it should be asked, what is the idea of a circle? I answer, It is the conception of a circle. What is the immediate object of this conception? The immediate and the only object of it is a circle. But where is this circle? It is no where. If it was an individual, and had a real existence, it must have a place; but being a universal, it has no existence, and, therefore no place. (EIP, 422)

Every triangle that really exists must have a certain length of sides and measure of angles; it must have place and time (EIP 478)

In these passages, Reid commits himself to the claims that (i) something really exists if and only if it is an individual and (ii) something is an individual if and only if it is located in space/time. Under the pluralist interpretation, when making these claims, Reid employs what we might call the "real existence" quantifier, which ranges over only individuals. When Reid writes, as he often does, that universals (and creatures of fiction such as centaurs) do not exist, what he means is that they do not really exist. Under the pluralist interpretation, this comes to the claim that the "really exists" quantifier fails to range over universals (and other abstracta, such as creatures of fiction).

Another thing to be said in favor of this reading is that, in other passages, Reid is willing to speak of universals as existing but not really existing:

Ideas are said to have a real existence in the mind, at least, while we think of them; but universals have no real existence. When we ascribe existence to them, it is not an existence in time or place, but existence in some individual subject; and this existence means no more but that they are truly attributes of such a subject. Their existence is nothing but predictability, or the capacity of being attributed to a subject. (EIP, 516)

When making these claims, Reid appears to both reject the claim that universals really exist (since they're not individuals) and to commit himself to the claim that they exist (in the sense that they're predicable). Under the pluralist interpretation, Reid is saying that the real existence quantifier does not range over universals. But there is another quantifier -- call it the "abstracta quantifier" -- which ranges over only abstracta, such as universals and creatures of fiction, which are the objects of (at least some cases of) conception. That is why he can say that they exist in a certain sense.

If this position could be worked out, there would be at least several advantages to attributing it to Reid. One is that it would save Reid from affirming claims such as (D) and (E), which Van Cleve ultimately concedes would be desirable given how puzzling they are (296). Another virtue is that it would provide Reid a principled escape from the following apparently inconsistent triad:

P. We can and do think of things that do not exist.

Q. Thinking-of is a relation.

R. There can be no relations to the nonexistent. (270)

Under the actual Meinongian reading, Reid accepts P and Q but must reject R, albeit at the cost of holding that there are nonexistent entities to which we can stand in cognitive relations. Under the pluralist reading, a satisfactory response to this triad requires us to disambiguate its claims. Under the pluralist interpretation, if this triad's first claim is to have any chance of generating an inconsistency and be acceptable to Reid, it must say:

P'. We can and do think of things that do not really exist.

Given P', the only way to generate an inconsistency would be to read R as:

R'. There can be no relations to things that do not really exist.

Under the pluralist interpretation, Reid has a principled reason for rejecting this claim. For among the things that do not really exist are universals. But universals, Reid says, are predicables and, thus, are by their very essence the sort of thing to which we can stand in cognitive relations since they are among the objects of thought. Indeed, at various points, Reid suggests that they owe some of their attributes to our cognitive activity.

When faced with rival interpretations such as these, any interpreter must countenance the possibility that there may be no fact of the matter about which position -- actual Meinongianism or ontological pluralism -- Reid embraced. In that case, attributing to Reid a commitment to ontological pluralism would be an exercise not in exegesis but in charitable rational reconstruction.[2]

[1] Reid distinguishes the first principles of contingent truths from those of necessary truths. Van Cleve focuses on the former of which Reid identifies twelve.

[2] Thanks to Tyler Doggett, Andrew Malcovsky, and Jim Van Cleve for their feedback on a draft of this review.