Problems of Rationality

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Donald Davidson, Problems of Rationality, Oxford University Press, 2004, xx+280 pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-19-823755-e.

Reviewed by Richard Rorty, Stanford University


Donald Davidson, who died in the summer of 2003 at the age of eight-six, was a systematic philosopher of great originality and daring. He ventured out on uncharted seas of thought. But he never wrote a treatise, only essays. Each essay presents a portion of the system that he spent his life constructing, but the lack of a treatise makes it hard to grasp the over-all shape of his thought.

Despite insightful and sympathetic commentaries by Bjorn Ramberg, Jeffrey Malpas, and others, it has remained difficult to piece Davidson's writings together. Each commentator has suggested a somewhat different way of relating "Truth and Meaning" to "Actions, Reasons and Causes", and "Mental Events" to "On the Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme". Critics of Davidson typically zeroed in a single essay, and his responses were often confined to fairly narrow points. He rarely published explicit criticisms of the work of others. So it has been hard to situate him—to get a clear sense of how his views resemble and differ from those of such figures as Wittgenstein, Quine, Sellars, Dummett, Putnam, Kripke, McDowell and Brandom.

Davidson addressed this problem by agreeing, some years ago, to let Oxford University Press bring out a five-volume edition of his writings, organized thematically rather than chronologically. He worked hard revising the individual essays, and deciding how they might best be arranged so as to shed light on one another. But only three volumes had appeared at the time of his death. As Marcia Cavell tells us in her very helpful introduction, some editorial questions concerning the last two had not yet been settled. She resolved these herself, with the help of Ernie LePore. The volume under review is the fourth of the series. The fifth and final one will appear shortly, under the title Truth, Language and History.

Problems of Rationality is divided into three parts. The first four essays defend the claim that judgments of value are objectively true. The next six expound what Davidson called "a unified theory of thought, meaning, and action". The last four discuss the problems that weakness of will and self-deception raise for Davidson's claim that ascription of intention and belief is possible only if we assume the agent's rationality. I shall discuss the three parts in sequence.


Perhaps the most divisive issue in contemporary analytic philosophy is about whether philosophers can do what Wittgenstein thought could not be done: whether they can get between language and the world and say something enlightening about how the two do, or do not, fit together. Davidson was on Wittgenstein's side. As he famously said in "A Nice Derangement of Epitaphs", he hoped to erase "the boundary between knowing a language and knowing our way around the world generally".

Davidson agreed with Sellars that "belief and desire, and all the other propositional attitudes, depend on language" (p. 16) and so he distinguished sharply between the mere ability to discriminate X's from other things—an ability we share with the brutes--and a grasp of the concept of X. (p. 8). If knowledge is impossible without concepts, if grasping a concept is knowing how to use a word, and if there can be neither a private language nor one untranslatable into English, then "the acquisition of knowledge is not based on a progression from the subjective to the objective; it emerges holistically and is interpersonal from the start". (p. 18)

Since skepticism about other minds and an external world depends on the assumption that we start with the subjective and move outward, Davidson thought such skepticism unintelligible. (See pp. 5-6) He thought the same of skepticism about our knowledge of what is objectively valuable. "Value judgments are true and false in much the way our factual judgments are." (p. 49) Further, just as any rational being must share many of our beliefs, so she must share many of our desires, and thus many of our values. In both areas "common ground is not subsequent to understanding, but a condition of it." (p. 51)

We should explain failure to agree about values "by appeal to the gap between apparent values and real values (just as we explain failure to agree on ordinary descriptive facts by appeal to the distinction between appearance and reality)". (p. 50) Drawing the appearance-reality distinction, on Davidson's account, is not the province of a specialized discipline called "ontology". It is something we do every day, simply by reaching agreement with one another about what is the case and about what is to be done.

In short, there is objectivity wherever there is rational argumentation. The skeptic's question "Yes, but does what we are arguing about really exist?" presupposes that once coherence is attained there is a further question about correspondence to be answered. Davidson rejected that presupposition in "A Coherence Theory of Truth and Knowledge".

That rejection has led some critics to call Davidson a "linguistic idealist"—a philosopher who believes that there is no such thing as objective reality, or at least none that we can get in touch with. But, as he insisted in "The Structure and Content of Truth", he was neither a realist nor an anti-realist. He wanted to undercut that distinction. Anyone who follows out his line of thought will become unable to take seriously either arguments about realism vs. anti-realism or metaethical controversies about cognitivism vs. non-cognitivism.


In the second part of the book, Davidson explains how that thesis gears in with the arguments of early essays such as "Truth and Meaning" and "Radical Interpretation". The original inspiration for those essays was Quine's demonstration that an interpreter must play ascriptions of belief to a speaker off against ascriptions of meaning to her utterances, in the hope of maximizing the coherence of both. Davidson took a further step by showing that "an empirical theory of meaning forces us to bring desires or preference, as well as belief, into the picture" (p. 159). When we do this we see that "[Tarski-style] theory of meaningÉand Bayesian decision theory are evidently made for each other". (p. 158)

Davidson marries these two by proposing that the interpreter be thought of as looking for evidence that the speaker prefers that one sentence be true rather than another. He builds on Richard Jeffrey's having "shown in detail how to extract subjective probabilities and values from preferences that propositions be true". (p. 160) Jeffrey had also shown us how to treat "motivational states like desires and cognitive states like beliefs" as "two attitudes toward the same set of propositions", differing principally in that "beliefs support a ratio scale, [whereas] desires support an interval scale". (p. 53)

Davidson brings Jeffrey together with Tarski by substituting sentences for propositions, and requiring the interpreter to "attend, not just to the agent's preferences among sentences, but also to the events and objects in the world that cause her preferences" (p. 165) The interpreter will then find himself putting together "a theory of truth that says that an utterance by the agent of the sentence 'The coffee is ready' is true if and only if the coffee is ready." (p. 165). He will simultaneously develop views about what the agent's utterances mean, about what she believes, about what she wants, and about what she is doing.

This unified theory "like any scientific theory, presents a clear and precise formal structure with demonstrable merits. There are only a few undefined concepts, and these are extensional." (p. 126). But, unlike most scientific theories, it has no practical application. Davidson did not think that anybody should waste time trying to specify satisfaction conditions for the various predicates of English, nor did he want field linguists to start filling their notebooks with data on speaker's preferences for the truth of one sentence over another.

The unified theory is not meant, he writes, "to throw any light on how in real life we come to understand each other". It is rather "a conceptual exercise aimed at revealing the dependencies among our basic propositional attitudes at a level fundamental enough to avoid the assumption that we can come to grasp them—or intelligibly attribute them to others---one at a time." (p. 166). The theory "does not attempt to provide useful hints to real linguists". (p. 131) It is rather an answer to the question "what it is about propositional thought—our beliefs, desires, intentions and speech—that makes them intelligible". (p. 133) What makes them intelligible is that they all hang together, both with each other and with their causes.

What Quine called "the idea idea" has, from Locke to Chomsky, encouraged hopes for a science of mind and language that would explain how less well understood complexes are constructed out of better understood mental and semantic atoms. Davidson is not proposing that holism will succeed where atomism has failed. Rather, he is urging that we abandon all such hopes. The cognitive sciences, on his view, have no philosophical import. Chomsky's and Fodor's criticisms of him are beside his point. For the philosophical questions he is concerned with "cannot be answered by discovering neural mechanisms, studying the evolution of the brain, or finding evidence that explains the incredible ease and rapidity with which we come to have a first language". (p. 133)

So though cognitive science may achieve much, it will never culminate in a science of rationality or of thought. There is no step-by-step progression from sensing to thinking, because there is no step that takes us from non-norms to norms There may be a story about how norms become explicit (of the sort told by Brandom) but there is no empiricist-style story to be told about how thoughts arise from non-thoughts—no way to avoid thinking of rationality as sui generis.

Davidson thought that analytic philosophy needed to be rescued from both reductionism and empiricism, and that Quine's dissolution of the language-fact distinction had pointed us in the right direction. But he also thought that Quine failed to understand the implications of his own work. In the interview with Ernie Lepore that forms a very enlightening appendix to this volume, Davidson said that "you can find most of Quine's epistemology in C. I. Lewis minus the analytic-synthetic distinction. I don't think that Quine knows the extent to which there is a sequence that starts with Kant and goes through C. I. Lewis and ends with Quine." (p. 237) Davidson wanted to break Kant's hold. Philosophers in the Kant-to-Quine sequence, he argued, had all taken some form of the scheme-content distinction for granted. In "The Very Idea of a Conceptual Scheme" Davidson pressed holism to its limit by setting that distinction aside.

Doing so enabled him to treat objective truth as the automatic result of rational thought, rather than as something upon which the skeptic might throw doubt. Coherence of belief, he argued, insured objectivity, for to say that a proposition has an objective truth-value is to say no more than that belief will not make it true, nor disbelief false. This, in turn, is just to say that any particular belief we have might be erroneous (even though most of them cannot be).

To give up the scheme-content distinction is to give up the correspondence theory of truth, and to rid oneself of the fear that nature might classify things into kinds differently than we do. "Nature in its causal doings is indifferent to our supply of concepts" (p. 142), and it has no concepts of its own. There is no chance that our classifications might not be nature's, because we cannot make sense of the idea of anything other than a conceptualizer doing any classifying. There is nothing non-conceptual to which our concepts should, or could, be faithful. This means that judgments deploying "ignoble" are as objective as those deploying "round". So there is no point in comparing rocks, values and thoughts in respect of worthiness to be included in an inventory of "what really exists".


The third section of this book is devoted to the need to explain irrationality (e.g., self-deception, Freudian slips, akratic acts) by finding "a mechanism that can be accepted as appropriate to mental processes but does not rationalize what is to be explained." (p. 190) The explanation, Davidson says, must respect the fact that no propositional attitude can be irrational in itself, but only as part of a larger pattern. (See p. 192) He provided the needed account in his much discussed essay of 1978 , "Paradoxes of Irrationality", reprinted here. In that essay he suggests that we think of the Freudian unconscious as a second person sharing the brain with the conscious mind. The network of beliefs and desires in the unconscious mind is just as coherent as the one in the conscious mind. But the two networks do not interlock. From the point of view of your conscious self, a Freudian slip is the intrusion of an arational cause. But your partitioned-off unconscious had its reasons.

Akrasia manifests the same pattern: "What the agent found himself doing had a reason—the passion or impulse that overcame his better judgment—but that reason was not his." (p. 175) For Davidson, judgments of irrationality are "as objective as any of our attributions of thoughts, desires and intentions" (p. 198) for the same reason as judgments of value are: "all thinking creatures subscribe to my basic standards or norms of rationality" (p. 195). There cannot be alternative rationalities, any more than there can be competing conceptual schemes. Irrationality always involves inconsistency—but it is unconscious inconsistency. Partitioning is made possible by the fact that we can believe that p and believe that not-p without believing that (p and not-p). (See p. 217)


As befits a reviewer who is also a fervent disciple, I have used the space at my disposal to expound Davidson's views rather than to criticize them. I think that most of his critics have failed to grasp the audacity of his outlook—to realize that he is calling for what he once referred to as a "sea-change" in philosophical thinking. That change would make much of contemporary philosophical discussion seem as absurd as scholastic philosophy seemed to Hobbes and Descartes.

Davidson had no taste for polemics, and he was too courteous ever to adopt a merely dismissive tone toward colleagues with whom he disagreed. But his ideas were as radically subversive of the traditional problematic of post-Cartesian philosophy as were Wittgenstein's.

Many who have no use for Wittgenstein have none for Davidson, and for the same reason: to adopt the views of either would be to dissolve problems which they have spent the best years of their lives trying to solve.

Wittgenstein is no longer much read in graduate philosophy programs, and perhaps Davidson too will cease to be assigned. But if these five volumes of essays do suffer the neglect presently being suffered by Philosophical Investigations, they will remain, like time bombs, on the library shelves. They will be detonated sooner or later.