Problems of Religious Luck: Assessing the Limits of Reasonable Religious Disagreement

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Guy Axtell, Problems of Religious Luck: Assessing the Limits of Reasonable Religious Disagreement, Lexington, 2019, 280pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781498550178.

Reviewed by Liz Jackson, Australian National University/Ryerson University


Many of us wouldn't have the beliefs we do now if we were born in a different family or culture. But since our family and culture could have easily been different, it looks like these beliefs are the result of luck. We nonetheless continue to hold these socially-conditioned beliefs, in many cases in full awareness of the luck involved. Are most of us irrational? Is widespread skepticism appropriate?

In this book, Guy Axtell joins this important conversation about lucky belief, with an eye toward the religious case. He focuses on the epistemic justification of religious belief: the "de jure question" (p. 6). Axtell's main target is religious exclusivism -- a doctrinal or soteriological uniqueness that sets a particular religion apart from other religions. The first part, chapters 1 and 2, provides background on the philosophy of luck and explains what Axtell calls the 'New Problem of Religious Luck,' an argument that the beliefs of religious exclusivists suffer from a malignant strand of epistemic luck. The second part (chapters 3-6) focuses on implications and applications of this problem. Axtell connects his argument to some recent work in psychology and cognitive science of religion (chapters 4 and 6) and advances a second argument against exclusivism (chapter 5).

Chapter 1 begins with a taxonomy of religious luck. Although these distinctions do not play a large role in the book's subsequent arguments, they are still valuable to set the stage for later work. Axtell focuses on six categories of religious luck, although he doesn't take his list to be exhaustive. He begins with distinctions in the moral luck literature. The first two are closely associated: resultant religious luck (luck in the way things turn out) and criterial religious luck (luck in the criteria used). Criterial luck often causes resultant luck; one example is from Sider (2002), who argues that a heaven/hell binary forces an arbitrary moral cutoff. On Sider's picture, everyone's going to either heaven or hell involves both criterial luck -- in the principle that determines who goes where -- and resultant luck. The third is constitutive religious luck (luck in who one is). Axtell's example involves the caste system that used to be a central part of Hinduism, in which the caste one was born into was considered part of one's identity, determining one's social mobility and economic opportunities (p. 17).

The next three kinds of religious luck arise from the epistemology literature. The fourth is propositional religious luck (believing something for bad reasons when good reasons are luckily available). For instance, a person forms a religious belief on an epistemically bad basis (e.g., wishful thinking), but, by luck, has other, causally inerrant evidence that could justify her belief. The final two are associated with Gettier cases: intervening veritic religious luck (the kind of luck at play in traditional Gettier cases), and environmental veritic religious luck (the kind of luck at play in the fake barn case). Axtell discusses a fascinating religious Gettier case to illustrate intervening veritic religious luck. According to Karl Barth (who, admittedly, holds a minority theological view), religious beliefs are subjectively justified because of the way they are ingrained into culture, but nonetheless, God views all religions as an idolatrous human creation that should be "judged and rejected." However, at some point, God intervenes and chooses the Christian religion as a locus of revelation, "transforming an idol into a means of salvation" (pp. 23-24). This parallels traditional Gettier cases in which a justified belief is false by luck (religious belief, though subjectively justified, is idolatrous and false) but then made true by luck (God's choosing Christianity as a means of salvation). Axtell closes chapter 1 with a longer discussion of testimonial and religious analogs of the fake barn case with his 'Tess case' (pp. 27-34).

A final distinction from chapter 1 that plays a key role in the Axtell's later arguments involves two kinds of religious exclusivism. Soteriological exclusivism is exclusivism about salvation. A soteriologically exclusive religion X would say, for example, that only adherents of X will be saved. Doctrinal exclusivism, on the other hand, is exclusivism about religious truth; for instance, religion X is uniquely true and others are false (p. 24). One could be a doctrinal exclusivist without being a soteriological exclusivist: e.g., X is uniquely true, but you need not practice X to be saved. A somewhat more odd but possible combination is soteriological exclusivism without doctrinal exclusivism: e.g., all religions are equally true, but one must practice X to be saved.

Before moving on, I want to note a few points of agreement between Axtell and me. We share a commitment to epistemic permissivism -- the thesis that there can be more than one rational opinion on certain matters, given a body of evidence. Suppose, for example, you and I disagree on whether God exists; the permissivist would argue that this is possible even if we are both fully rational and share evidence. Second, throughout the book, but especially in the later chapters, Axtell argues that peer disagreement doesn't always warrant a unified response: "I reject universalist theories [of peer disagreement] -- those that claim there is a strong master principle that tells us how we ought to respond to disagreement" (p. 184). This is plausible; to assume that peer disagreement always calls for conciliation or steadfastness strikes me as overly simplistic. Further, some theories can nicely demarcate where each response is appropriate. For example, it may be that permissive cases are ones in which we can remain steadfast. However, the permissivist doesn't claim that all bodies of evidence are permissive -- and those that aren't may be where disagreement requires conciliation.

With that background in place, I turn to a more detailed explanation and evaluation of the rest of the book. Because of space constraints, I will focus on Axtell's two main arguments against exclusivism in chapters 2 and 5. I will raise some problems for these arguments and discuss areas for further research.

Chapter 2 is a defense of what I take to be the book's central argument, 'The New Problem of Religious Luck.' This problem centrally relies on the concept of counterinduction, a process of reasoning that reverses the logic of induction. For example, the sun rose yesterday, and the day before, and the day before, but nonetheless, I believe it will not rise tomorrow. Some versions of the gambler's fallacy also involve counterinduction. Axtell (plausibly) assumes counterinductive thinking is generally irrational (p. 57). He then lays out the problem as follows (argument below quoted from pp. 58-59):

(DS) For the great majority of religious adherents, had s/he been raised in a family or culture with a different predominate religious identification than that in which s/he was actually raised, but with the same natural capacities and intellectual temperament, s/he very likely would come to identify herself with that religion, with roughly the same degree of personal conviction.

(ES) The epistemologically-relevant level of generality at which to characterize the belief-forming cognitive process by which persons in a great majority of cases, and across epistemic locations, acquire their religion, denomination, or sect-specific beliefs is a level of testimonial-authority assumption.

(EA) Religious believers of exclusivist orientation in the actual world whose original mode of belief acquisition is aptly described by (DS) and (ES) would likely, if raised in a different epistemic location with a different but still exclusivist dominant testimonial tradition, a) adopt as uniquely true and salvific beliefs that in the actual world they hold to be erroneous; and b) ascribe falsity and error to beliefs that in the actual world they hold to be true.

(CIT) Religious believers in the actual world whose model of belief acquisition and maintenance is aptly described by (DS), (ES), and (EA) ascribe to a mode of belief acquisition and maintenance that should, by their own lights, be acknowledged as counter-inductive thinking.

The line Axtell seems to be pushing is this: most people in exclusivist religions acquire their beliefs via testimony from religious authority. If so, then if they'd grown up in another family/culture, they'd have beliefs they now think to be false and would disavow the beliefs they now have. So in most scenarios in which they use the same belief-forming method, their beliefs would be false, but, contra that pattern, they assume their actual religious beliefs are true. Thus, exclusivist religious beliefs are an instance of counterinductive thinking. Since counterinduction is irrational, exclusivist religious belief is irrational.

One of my main concerns involves Axtell's purported target of religious exclusivism. First, note that, insofar as this is a problem for exclusivism, Axtell's target appears to be doctrinal rather than soteriological exclusivism. I think his idea is that if all religions are, in some sense, "equally true," then, epistemically, it won't matter what religion I believe. If I had been born elsewhere and practiced a different religion, my religious beliefs would still be true.

However, it is not clear that this argument has the narrow scope that Axtell claims (i.e., creating a unique problem for religious exclusivism). First, what if I had been brought up with no religion at all? Surely atheism and theism are not equally true. But if I had been taught atheism from a young age, I would likely practice no religion; theistic beliefs are no less subject to luck than exclusivist religious beliefs. Insofar as this argument is a defeater for exclusivist religious beliefs, it also seems problematic for theistic beliefs more generally.

Theistic beliefs don't seem to be the only kind of beliefs affected by luck. Axtell references a class of beliefs that J. Adam Carter (2018) calls 'controversial beliefs' that includes religious beliefs, moral beliefs, political beliefs, philosophical beliefs, and others (p. 54). Many of these beliefs share the same supposedly problematic characteristics of exclusivist religious beliefs -- they are deeply dependent on family and culture, and accepted at least partially based on testimony. For instance, consider a common, current moral belief: discrimination on the basis of sex and race is wrong. It is likely that, if you were born hundreds of years ago into a culture where discrimination was treated morally differently, you would not have this same belief (Plantinga 1997: 297-8). This is likely also true for many political beliefs, e.g., that democracy is better than totalitarianism (van Inwagen 1995: 238).

Therefore, if we accept Axtell's reasoning, a large class of our beliefs are unjustified. Some might agree. Maybe radical epistemic humility is appropriate, and Axtell's argument is an interesting way to motivate this conclusion. However, I worry this is too extreme. We have good reason to think these beliefs are justified -- it doesn't seem like we are rationally obliged to suspend judgment on almost all of our political, moral, and philosophical beliefs. And the issue is not merely the scope of the skepticism: some of these beliefs, e.g., the belief that discrimination is wrong, are ones we clearly should not give up. The exclusivist can thus advance a Moorean response to Axtell's argument.

Further, the premises are resistible. Consider (ES), which characterizes the level of belief-formation relevant for epistemic evaluation. Note that (ES) assumes a level of belief-formation that is quite general, involving accepting religious testimony or revelation. However, religious exclusivists likely aren't going to grant that their belief-forming method was no better than anyone else's. They would likely maintain that (ES) doesn't pick out the correct level of generality to evaluate the belief -- maybe the process should be more specific or refer to features of a certain religion. Axtell addresses this worry on pp. 61-62 and 70-73, arguing that it is not clear what would justify a more fine-grained process type. He argues further that certain kinds of process types might raise new luck-related worries -- e.g., if the process type references 'the true' religion, then it seems lucky that one used that process type rather than another. Axtell is correct that those who advocate for a more specific process type need to justify use of that type. However, whether luck-related worries come up depends on which process type is chosen and how it is justified, and it is not clear that a project developing this couldn't overcome Axtell's objections. Generally, then, the exclusivist should push back on (ES). (For further discussion, see Baker-Hytch 2014.)

Axtell's second argument against exclusivism comes in chapter 5. Here Axtell discusses two kinds of soteriological exclusivism: particularist and mutualist.  Particularist exclusivists believe their religion is uniquely salvific, and that theirs is the only religion whose adherents are justified in believing their religion is uniquely salvific. Mutualist exclusivists believe that their religion is uniquely salvific, but that adherents of other exclusivist religions are also justified in salvific exclusivist beliefs: "the mutualist does not talk just about the right of adherents of one specific religion to assert exclusivism, but the adherents of any and all 'home' religions" (p. 144).

Axtell argues that mutualist exclusivism is "in deep tension with itself" (p. 168). He formalizes this in the following way (p. 196):

  1. Mutualism implies the reasonableness of religious aliens in maintaining belief in their home faith-tradition even after exposure to ours.
  2. The reasonableness of religious aliens in maintaining belief in their home faith tradition even after exposure to ours implies the reasonableness of any one person's non-belief in any other person's home faith-tradition.
  3. A just creator's final judgment of a person's religious value would not devalue transcendentally false but reasonable belief or non-belief in any one person's home faith-tradition.
  4. If a just creator's final judgment of a person's religious value does not devalue trait x, then it allows for the value (actually or at least potentially) of trait x.
  5. So by 1-4, a just creator's final judgment of a person's religious value allows for the religious value (actually or at least potentially) of religious aliens with the trait of reasonably maintaining belief in their home faith-tradition even after exposure to ours.
  6. (5) is the thesis of salvific inclusivism, and the denial of salvific exclusivism.
  7. Therefore, by 1-6, mutualist salvific exclusivism implies its own negation.

This argument raises a host of issues worthy of further examination. For one, it's not clear that (6) is true, because God could acknowledge that certain religions have some kind of religious value (e.g., they recognize there is a creator, they rightfully attribute certain qualities to that creator, they prescribe certain morally good actions) while also justly denying them salvation. The mere acknowledgment that a religion has value is a relatively weak claim, and this doesn't preclude justly refusing adherents salvation.

Axtell intends to argue that mutualism entails that a just God wouldn't exclude people from salvation due to certain reasonable beliefs they have. There are two issues here: what are the beliefs in question, and why would those beliefs warrant inclusion? Based on the definition of mutualism, it seems like the relevant belief is that one's home religion is uniquely salvific. However, this higher-order belief may be rational while one's first-order religious beliefs are irrational. For example, one might have a good argument that generally, religions ought to be soteriologically exclusive, but have no justification for their first-order beliefs regarding their home religion. Thus, God might condemn someone based on their first-order religious beliefs, even if their higher-order mutualist beliefs are rational. Axtell's target thus should not be mere soteriological exclusivism.

A second issue concerns the reasonableness or rationality at stake in the argument. At first glance, it might seem like the argument concerns epistemic rationality. However, it is possible that beliefs can be evaluated from perspectives other than the epistemic one -- e.g., a stereotyping belief might be epistemically justified but nonetheless morally and all-things-considered impermissible. God might then justly condemn someone whose beliefs are epistemically rational but fail in these other domains.

Thus, for the argument to work, it needs to (i) address beliefs beyond those about soteriological exclusivity, and (ii) address ways of holding those beliefs that go beyond epistemic rationality. Further, making changes to account for (i) and (ii) together may not even be sufficient for the conclusion to follow, because God might have other reasons for denying someone salvation, e.g., their other beliefs, actions, intentions, character, etc. So, the argument needs more development to create a real problem for the mutualist soteriological exclusivity.

Overall, the contingency of belief is a fascinating issue that deserves serious consideration. I'm hopeful that Axtell's book draws more attention to the intriguing problems raised by religious luck.


A huge thanks to Chris Tweedt for extensive discussion and comments on the above material. Thanks also to Rebecca Chan, Dustin Crummett, Justin D'Ambrosio, Brett Lunn, and Meghan Page for helpful feedback and discussion. This review was supported by Australian Research Council Grant D17010139.


Baker-Hytch, Max. (2014). "Religious Diversity and Epistemic Luck." The International Journal for Philosophy of Religion 76: 171-191.

Carter, J. Adam. (2018) "On Behalf of Controversial View Agnosticism." European Journal of Philosophy 26: 1358-1370.

Plantinga, Alvin. (1997). "Ad Hick." Faith and Philosophy. 14(3): 295-298.

Sider, Theodore. (2002). "Hell and Vagueness." Faith and Philosophy. 19(1): 58-68.

van Inwagen, Peter. (1995). "Non est Hick." In The Rationality of Belief and the Plurality of Faith: Essays in Honor of William P. Alston (Thomas Senor, ed.), 216-241. London: Cornell University Press.