Process Philosophical Deliberations

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Nicholas Rescher, Process Philosophical Deliberations, Ontos, 2006, 195pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 3938793376.

Reviewed by James Bradley, Memorial University of Newfoundland


This collection of essays is volume eleven in a rich and varied series on 'Process Thought' being produced by Ontos, a press that is notable for its original and adventurous initiatives on a wide range of philosophical topics. Ontos is also bringing out the Nicholas Rescher Collected Papers in thirteen volumes, which readers can now add to Rescher's own books, numbering approximately one hundred. As is well known, in a prolific publishing career that has spanned some sixty years, Rescher has woven together themes in logic, idealism, pragmatism, philosophy of science and futuristics. In recent years, he has incorporated the tradition of 'process philosophy' into his strongly pragmatist 'conceptual idealism'. As the Preface to Process Philosophical Deliberations tells us, the present volume is one of a series he has written on process thought over the last eleven years.

The collection comprises ten essays arranged into ten chapters. The first chapter introduces many of the themes subsequently elaborated. These include useful taxonomies of process philosophies and a healthy insistence on the close relations of process and analytical philosophy (Chapters 1 and 2); critiques of ethical and historical relativism (Chapters 3 and 4); a defense of free will agency (Chapter 5); and a series of chapters on the nature of knowledge (Chapter 6) considered in relation to various theories of scientific progress (Chapter 7), the concept of dialectic (Chapter 8), the complexity of knowledge (Chapter 9), and theories of the future (Chapter 10), which last includes another useful taxonomy of different perspectives on the future. All these issues are considered through the prism of Rescher's process perspective and they are treated in the direct, vigorous style that characterizes his writings. Even if this style often borders on the purely assertive and can sometimes convey the impression that this is philosophy done by fiat, there is in Rescher a sweep and boldness, as well as a readiness to cut to the quick of an issue and bring it to resolution, which can be refreshing as often as it seems overhasty.

Although all of the essays in this volume are accessible to the general reader, the assessment of what exactly Rescher means by a 'process perspective' is not always easy. Even if one consults (some of) his other works, one is left wondering how his strictly methodological pragmatism and his strongly Kantian conceptual idealism -- which amount to the claim that we know reality only as it is for us and not as it is in itself -- stand to process philosophy in any of its usual guises. Process philosophers such as Peirce and Whitehead -- to stay within a broadly analytical orbit -- characteristically make claims that, while reflexively understood to be fallible and revisable, are nevertheless ontological claims, claims about the nature of reality itself. In Rescher, however, it would seem that even a proposition such as "being is ultimately a matter of activity" (p. 2) is strictly an epistemic claim. Hence Rescher can strongly disagree with the central tenet of thinkers like Peirce and Whitehead that an irreducibly free activity of actualization extends all the way down in nature and is not, as Rescher holds, confined to rational human agents (pp. 73-74). Again, Rescher sees order or systematicity not as a fundamental feature of the real, as it is held to be in Peirce's 'thirdness' and Whitehead's (very different) 'creativity', but as a Kantian regulative or heuristic device (p.144). And while Peirce and Whitehead maintain the infinity or inexhaustibility of reality to be essential to any concept of processual dynamic, Rescher holds that infinity is no more than a matter of cognitive complexity (p.107), something that is presumably simply an empirical given. From a Peircean perspective, Rescher is, like Kant, a nominalist: he thinks that vagueness -- the inapplicability of the law of excluded middle -- applies only to certain types of propositions and not to real structures in general. Hence there is for Rescher such a thing as "the truth" (p.80), a set of absolutely determinate entities that constitute the real but to which we have no access. For Peirce, by contrast, there are no absolutely determinate entities, while for Whitehead reality itself is a constructive activity in which there are no final adjustments. For these reasons, both would deny that "language use" alone both decides what analytic propositions there are and settles their "truth status" (p. 81). A key difference here is the absence in Rescher of one of the main features of process philosophy: namely, an ontological theory of truth in which reality is held to be the unfolding and manifestation of the real.

As these comments indicate, perhaps the most difficult aspect of Rescher's position in the present volume is his treatment of universals. He advocates a "conjunctive" theory of universals that encompasses a nominalism for concrete particulars, a conceptualism for emergent universals (such as 'lover of Shakespeare') and a platonic realism for extra-temporal abstracta (pp. 16, 79). These terms only serve to mask Rescher's nominalism about the noumenal real. In that context, his "realism" is no more than an honorific term for those mind-generated structures that can be treated atemporally. All of Rescher's universals are in fact ideal objects envisaged by the mind but having no metaphysical status otherwise. This is a pure conceptualism that fits completely with his nominalism about the real, and it only generates confusion to pretend it to be anything else. The fact that Rescher is prepared to play fast and loose with terms such as 'realism' with respect to universals -- an approach that would have horrified Bergson as much as Peirce and Whitehead -- puts a question mark next to his claim to be taken seriously as a process philosopher.

Admittedly, there can be no doubt that Rescher's work consistently stands out, not only in virtue of his readiness to introduce dynamical principles and categories into the frozen, static universe of mainstream Frege-Russell analysis, but also in virtue of his long campaign against piecemeal conceptual engineering in favor of the importance of systematic considerations. It is also true that there are no privileged holders of the title 'process philosopher'. But in Rescher's case it can fairly be said that only if Kant is thought as a fully-fledged process philosopher is Rescher one also. The fact is, of course, that one of the few things on which thinkers who are regularly included in the process pantheon agree is their repudiation of the Kantian divide between the ideal and the real.

One final remark on the book. Although physically durable and solid, it is full of typographical errors. The present reader counted twenty-five, three of which (on pp. 74, 79, 92) were so serious as to render the author's meaning obscure.