Processes of Life: Essays in the Philosophy of Biology

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John Dupré, Processes of Life: Essays in the Philosophy of Biology, Oxford University Press, 2012, 320pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199691982.

Reviewed by Robert A. Wilson, University of Alberta


This collection of sixteen essays, all but three of which have been published in the past five years, provides not only a glimpse into the mind of one of the leading philosophers of biology but also a keen sense of some of the new directions that the field has taken over the past decade. Despite the inevitable repetition one encounters across the essays, this will be a useful volume for those in the field to have. Dupré's writing is crisp and engaging, and given his focus on areas of biological science beyond those that have constituted the bread-and-butter of philosophical discussions, the volume should appeal as well to those wondering what all the excitement has been about in recent philosophy of biology.

One of the chief themes of these essays continues Dupré's signature resistance to reductionism in the philosophy of science in general and the philosophy of biology in particular, a resistance first expressed in Dupré's "Natural Kinds and Biological Taxa" (1981) and developed in his The Disorder of Things: Metaphysical Foundations of the Disunity of Science (1993). In Dupré's view, reductionism, unificationism, and monism, as closely related, general philosophical positions, are badly mistaken as views of the nature of science, especially the biological sciences. In their place, Dupré continues to advocate pluralistic views of scientific categories, methodology, and practice with the first essay, "The Miracle of Monism", arguing against monism because of its putative incompatibility with empiricism.

A second thematic thread that runs through the volume stems from Dupré's reflections on specifically biological phenomena and the concepts invoked to capture those phenomena. Chiefly through joint work with Maureen O'Malley that is reprinted here, Dupré sounds the siren loud and clear for the significance of the microbial world for a range of general views that both philosophers and biologists alike have taken for granted. The microbial world has come to occupy more central territory in a range of biological sciences in the past 50 years -- not only in epidemiology and disease-centred sciences and practices, but also in more obviously philosophically salient research on the levels of selection, on the early history of life, and on systematics and phylogeny. Dupré's view is that neglecting the microbial amounts to a damaging and limiting "macrobist" bias in the field. For example, attending to findings about the microbial world and its relation to the macrobial world provides reason to rethink our concept of a biological individual, and to view post-genetic research programs, such as metagenomics, with some enthusiasm. Dupré's Spinoza Lectures at the University of Amsterdam, "The Constituents of Life", reprinted as chapters 4 and 5, contain perhaps his clearest arguments for pluralism that appeal to the microbial world.

Dupré not only critiques some received views in the field but also offers more positive suggestions about how to think about life, organisms, and the organization of the biological world more generally. Two ideas pervade Dupré's more constructive thinking about key concepts and views about the biological world: the idea that living things in general and organisms in particular are processes, not entities, and the position that he calls promiscuous individualism.

To unpack this tantalizing coinage and to get some sense of how the microbial world is significant for such constructive views, consider symbiosis, the tight, mutually beneficial interdependence between two living things (typically organisms) that is typified by lichens, which are composite organisms made up of a fungus and either a cyanobacterium or some other photosynthesizing organism, such as green algae. Here is what Dupré says about symbiosis in describing the content of one of the essays in the volume:

Here I make for the first time the argument that the omnipresence of symbiosis should be seen as undermining the project of dividing living systems unequivocally into unique organisms, a conclusion I refer to in later chapters as 'promiscuous individualism', in parallel with my doctrine of promiscuous realism about species. (p.8; cf. p.241)

In this case, the appeal is to the putative pervasiveness of a given phenomenon (symbiosis) as the grounds for endorsing pluralism about organisms. Applying Dupré's well-known promiscuous realism here, we have not only the epistemic view that there are many legitimate ways to classify the world into biological individuals, including organisms, but the corresponding ontological view that such legitimation is provided by there being multiple biological individuals there to classify.

One sensible consequence of this view is that there is, at least often enough, no unique answer to the questions, asked of a particular biological situation, "How many biological individuals/organisms are there here?". As Dupré says, "what an organism is, and whether something is part of an organism or not, are not questions that necessarily admit of definitive answers" (p.153). But one should not under-estimate how ontologically radical promiscuous individualism is, and might even wonder whether the implied "not necessarily" here should be the stronger "necessarily do not".

For example, in the case of lichens, in challenging the view that there is just one organism (the lichen) or two organisms (the fungus and the cyanobacterium), an advocate of promiscuous individualism can readily make the case that there are three organisms (the lichen, the fungus, and the cyanobacterium), pointing to the different purposes and goals one might have in opting for either of the more monistic counts of organism numbers here. But given that it is a population of millions of cyanobacteria inhabiting any given fungus that jointly compose a lichen, and that there are multiple ways to draw the boundary between individual fungi of a given species, promiscuity runs rampant here. Dupré himself holds that populations of organisms, including multispecies populations, such as those found in microbial biofilms, can themselves be both biological individuals and organisms (pp.89, 175-176, 194, 203), and that "Whether a group of microbes is a closely connected ecological community or an organism may be a matter of biological judgment" (p.153). Promiscuous individualism thus seems to imply that there are many, many different numbers of individuals present in this paradigm case.

In the preceding paragraph I have shifted between talk of biological individuals and of organisms, and Dupré is clear (e.g., p.207) that the former cannot simply be equated with the latter (see also Wilson and Barker 2012). But what of these and kindred concepts -- biological individual, organism, living thing, life -- themselves? Like pluralism about species, an interesting pluralism about these biological phenomena needs to be more than some kind of disjunctivism about the corresponding concept. In "Varieties of Living Things" (chapter 12), written with O'Malley, Dupré advocates a more complete survey of the putative kinds of living things there are than philosophers of biology are usually content with, calling attention to prions, plasmids, and organelles in addition to more familiar, large, multicellular life forms. Of living things themselves, O'Malley and Dupré say that "matter is living when lineages are involved -- directly or indirectly -- in metabolism" (p.206), and view collaboration as a more central feature of living things than it is often acknowledged as being.

But O'Malley and Dupré are less clear both about how to move beyond these imprecise characterizations of living things and about the relationship between these interesting claims and promiscuous individualism, or how we should think about the various other putative criteria for life, such as reproduction, spatial boundedness, and evolvability. For example, while they rightly point to problems in identifying the exact physical boundaries for individual biological entities as a reason to question whether that criterion is strictly necessary, they appear to take the ability to reproduce to be a necessary condition for being a living thing (pp.208, 224), despite the fact that many organisms do not (and cannot) themselves reproduce. In addition, reproduction and metabolism, as central as they are to their view of living things, remain largely unexplained, despite the attention they have received in the work of others, such as James Griesemer and Peter Godfrey-Smith.

While I sympathize with Dupré's view that organisms are not the only biological entities of significance, the inferences one can draw from this point remain unclear. Consider "Metagenomics and Biological Ontology" (chapter 11), where Dupré and O'Malley argue that the metagenome, the set of genomic resources in a given environment, is a communal resource

and that the entity to which the resource is available is a coordinated, developing, multifunctional, multicellular organism composed of large numbers of cells of different varieties and capabilities, able to work in ways in which the collectivity regulates the functions of individuals (p.200).

Even in the space of this short sentence, a number of questions arise. First, why should we think that there is such a single entity at all, especially if we are proponents of promiscuous individualism? Second, what is the concept of an organism that would support the view that this entity is an organism? (For a pluralist, the same question could be asked of the various entities that make use of this communal resource.) Dupré and O'Malley later talk of biofilms as "organism-like communities" (p.203), and may not strictly endorse the biological ontology of metaorganisms that they at least seriously entertain. Yet this does not obviate but instead highlights the need for some more sustained, positive discussion of what organisms are. One issue is whether Dupré's pluralism implies that the question of whether metagenomics entails the existence of metaorganisms is misplaced.

Regarding organisms themselves, Dupré is clear enough about what they are not: they are not to be identified monogenomically, or as the sole kind of living thing, or as the only or even primary unit of selection. But what are organisms, on Dupré's view, and how are they distinguished from other biological individuals? Dupré identifies organisms as dynamic entities, as processes (not things), as life cycles, as collaboratively oriented, and as determined by the communities they form a part of as well as by what they are constituted by. When he says that "functioning biological individuals are typically symbiotic wholes involving many organisms of radically different kinds" (p.9), Dupré is clearly identifying something significant about both organisms and biological individuals more generally, much as he does when he identifies living things as existing at the intersection of metabolism and lineage. But he is reluctant, perhaps consistently so given his promiscuous individualism, to embrace the idea that there is a single criterion, or set of criteria, that the concept of an organism answers to. The tension that exists between this reluctance and the defence of particular claims about organisms (e.g., that there are metaorganisms) raises the question of whether a promiscuous individualist like Dupré owes us something more informative about what organisms are.

Similar questions might be asked about a range of other issues that Dupré discusses: whether viruses are living things (e.g., p.91), whether a gene really is "any bit of DNA that anyone has reason to name and keep track of" (p.112), and whether, referencing reductionism, genomics is best thought of as "the successor science to genetics that rejects this obsolete epistemology and methodology" (p.115). Dupré's discussion of all three of these issues can come across as flippant at times, in the last case raising some questions about another thread that runs through this volume, one concerning the social locatedness of the biological sciences.

Dupré knows the effects that misdirected biology has had with respect to race and gender, and apart from an essay dedicated to the former (chapter 15, "What Genes Are, and Why There are No 'Genes for Race'"), the volume also contains papers on the concept of disease and evolutionary psychology, the latter of these extending Dupré's critique from his Human Nature and the Limits of Science (2002). In fact, sensitivity to the social context in which both theory and practice in the biological sciences develop is manifest throughout much of the volume. This can make Dupré's enthusiasm for metagenomics seem strangely glib, especially given Dupré's anti-reductionism and that metagenomics itself might be seen as extending the reach of reductive research programs focused on those small agents of life, genes. More explicit reflection by Dupré on the social context not only of metagenomics but of the other theoretical directions in biology that these essays direct us to, such as developmental systems theory and epigenetics, would be a welcome complement to Processes of Life.


Dupré, J., 1981, "Natural Kinds and Biological Taxa", Philosophical Review, 90: 66-90.

Dupré, J., 1993, The Disorder of Things: Metaphysical Foundations of the Disunity of Science. New York: Oxford University Press.

Dupré, J., 2002, Human Nature and the Limits of Science. New York: Oxford University Press.

Wilson, Robert A., and M.J. Barker, 2012, "The Biological Notion of Individual", Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy, revised version in press.