Procreation, Parenthood, and Educational Rights: Ethical and Philosophical Issues

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Jaime Ahlberg and Michael Cholbi (eds.), Procreation, Parenthood, and Educational Rights: Ethical and Philosophical Issues, Routledge, 2017, 277pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781138206229.

Reviewed by David Archard, Queen's University Belfast


Do we have rights to create and to rear children? If so, what are their source, nature and scope? In recent years there has been a huge volume of new writing in this area, and the present book contributes a further set of pieces that seek to answer the basic questions stated. The volume considers procreative ethics, what it means to be a parent, and how to balance parental and children's interests in a defensible specification of how children should be brought up and educated. It is a mixed bag with some pieces that argue for distinctive and substantive positions, others that muse on the difficulties in reaching agreement to answers, and others that are on the whole only suggestive of ways to think about the problems.

The volume evidently derives from a conference on the issues and one regret is that there is a certain amount of overlap without mutual engagement. The work of the others is occasionally briefly acknowledged. But it would have been good to get a sense of real engagement between different positions -- for instance, on a central issue such as what exactly individual autonomy is and requires. Having said that, the co-editors' Introduction that provides the background context and a brief conspectus of the following chapters is exemplary in its clarity, precision and helpful signposting.

The debates here are heavily influenced by various seminal philosophical claims -- Derek Parfit's identification of the non-identity problem, Joel Feinberg's defense of a child's right to an 'open future,' and Hugh LaFollette's assertion that parents should be licensed. These set the terms in which most of those who write in this area feel obligated to argue. Thus, Michael Cholbi opens with an extremely interesting defense of a version of the anti-natalist view (most prominently developed by David Benatar) that in procreating we do a pro tanto wrong to the resultant child. This is not a wrong that needs understanding in the terms that are vulnerable to the non-identity problem, since it is not a wrong that must be construed as a making worse off than the procreative choice of a different child. One simply wrongs a child by, as Cholbi expresses it, 'encumbering the will' of that child, the encumbrance being the particular circumstances (genetic and material) of birth to some parents. Further, a child must become a moral agent and is circumscribed in what she must do and how she does it by her initial circumstances. Cholbi thinks that generative parents owe something to the children they have wronged through their creation. What is owed can only be discharged by the exercise of parental rights.

This claim bears some relation to those of Seana Shiffrin that procreation exposes a new person to unconsented risks of subsequent harms and of David Velleman that existence is a 'predicament' into which the child is thrown against her will. Cholbi's view is interestingly different and worth much more consideration than is possible here. But one immediate thought is this. Inasmuch as the encumbrance is particular (having this genetic constitution and these material circumstances) some prospective parents do more wrong than others by what they encumber their child with, and for some indeed the encumbrance is so significant as to suggest they should not be able to procreate. Why not license procreation if the reasoning of LaFollette in respect of custodial parenting -- individuals should be shown to be fit to expose others to serious risks -- is applied pari passu to generative parenting?

Russell DiSilvestro wonders in engaging personal terms about what exactly it means to say that one's child is one's own and what that means for how we should teach our children well. Jaime Ahlberg considers one problematic procreative choice, namely that of the kind of child one might have, a choice made possible by modern reproductive techniques and genetic testing. Here the background worry arises from cases of prospective parents deliberately choosing children that might share their own particular disability (such as deafness or achondroplasia). She argues persuasively that such parents should be held accountable for the social costs (such as those from special education) of such choices. She is also commendably willing to entertain, and evaluate, different forms of taxation to cover those costs.

Mianna Lotz offers a distinctive, and infrequently used, justification for the state support of procreation and parenthood that the childless may complain is unfair (insofar as it asks them to subsidize the preferences of those who do have children). It is that the state needs to secure the preconditions of its own future existence, namely healthy adult citizens motivated by an appropriate sense of justice.

Of course the question then arises as to whether the state thereby has reason only to support those who will, it may reasonably be assumed, bear and rear the right kinds of future citizens. As with Cholbi's chapter -- albeit on different grounds -- the intriguing eugenic implication of a certain position is suggested. Eugenics is never mentioned in name, nor indicated in outline throughout this collection. Yet liberals should not be averse in principle to the idea that we might properly find measures to determine what kinds of children we envisage as populating our future society.

The remaining essays are less concerned with procreative ethics, one final essay by Christine Overall apart. This takes up LaFollette's challenge and suggests that the experience of pregnancy -- in all of its various aspects -- is a sufficient preparation or education for parenting, such that the need for licensing is obviated. The argument is interesting. The evident problem is that Overall concedes that pregnancy is only 'a potential site' (255, my emphasis) for, and 'may not' (257) provide, the required education. If that is so the entailment claimed (having outlined the features of the experience of pregnancy), 'Hence, women who gestate their infants should not be required to submit to formal state screening and licensing' does not seem warranted. Indeed there is a further problem. If some women do not show signs of undergoing pregnancy in the right way, and as a proper preparation for motherhood, doesn't this provide an evident way of 'screening' them for parental adequacy and the subsequent grant (or not) of a license?

The chapters that deal with the scope of the parental liberty to rear and educate children all presuppose the liberal commitment to future adult autonomy, in some form, that animated Feinberg's celebrated essay. They are all in their different ways, and taken together, great evidence of philosophical liberalism's ongoing tussle with the balance between a growing child's right to a certain kind of future life and a parent's right to live the life she chooses to share with her offspring. Key U.S. legal cases are Yoder v Wisconsin [1972] (concerning the right of the Old Amish to withdraw their children early from state education in order to preserve their own community) that supplied the immediate context for Feinberg's essay; and Mozert v Hawkins [1987] in which Christian parents invoked their constitutional right to free exercise of religion to demand that their children's schools withdraw compulsory reading texts they viewed as denigrating their faith and teaching moral relativism. Marc Ramsay, in particular, offers a thoughtful, nuanced appraisal of the reasoning in the Mozert judgment and ought to give liberals pause by asking them to imagine how they would feel in an 'inverted' case where the schools' readings were deeply problematic for their value commitments.

What is important in this area is clarity about the teleological ideal of adult autonomy, and how far it is possible to clearly distinguish between the parent's (possibly morally innocuous) sharing of her life with her children and her (putatively morally problematic) 'enrolment' (to use Matthew Clayton's term) in a comprehensive view of the good life.

To take autonomy: Ramsay is right to distinguish various weaker and stronger senses of autonomy. The former are more congenial to those sympathetic to parents of faith (the all too frequent target of liberals who embrace a full blown strong version of autonomy). Moreover, it is good to be reminded of the dubious value of a species of rootless autonomy. Immersion in and commitment to a way of life, a culture, a community, can be good for traits of character -- resilience, steadfastness, courage, trust and loyalty -- without which autonomy can seem an attenuated personal virtue. Michael W. Austin's chapter is a fascinating exploration of how a child's undergoing of 'personal transformative experiences', and a sports education, can help with the development of such a character.

Both K. Lindsey Chambers and Roger Marples subscribe to a view of what kind of future autonomous adult the child is entitled to grow into that makes them skeptical about any more than a minimal construal of parental rights. Marples is to be commended for making one of the few comments in the book as a whole about equality and social justice when he criticizes Adam Swift's defense of a parent's right to send her child to private school. It would otherwise be easy if obviously mistaken to think that Rawlsian liberalism is only concerned with liberty, and not the fair distribution of other goods.

The penultimate essay by Samantha Brennan and Colin Macleod is a robustly argued, and empirically well supported, defense of the moral legitimacy of denying 'strongly homophobic' adults the right to have children. The argument turns on the interests of any gay child they might have. However, it would be interesting to hear how much more they might be prepared to disallow. Consider that there is a 'gay gene' and that prospective, homophobic parents underwent fertility treatment and Pre-implantation Genetic Diagnosis to select against any gay child. They could not, ex hypothesi, be denied the right to parent the straight children they subsequently had on the grounds that they were affectively inadequate parents to their gay child. Yet they would most probably rear a child that shared their detestable -- and deeply harmful -- homophobic views, one whose likely bullying of his gay peers would do as much damage as supports Brennan and Macleod's argument for the denial of the parental right in the first place.

Finally Ashli Anda's short and helpful summary of Hegel's account of the ethical justification of the family provides a useful reminder that not all philosophical writing in this area has to be Rawlsian.

A final thought: as briefly mentioned in the comments on Marples' chapter, there is little discussion of procreative, parental and children's rights in the context of social and economic inequality. The chapters all presuppose that the background society is an affluent, reasonably just Western one. It would have been interesting to hear someone ask the question of whether individuals have a right to procreate in extreme poverty, or whether adequate parenting requires the kind of social and economic support that would necessitate certain measures of distributive justice -- both intra- and internationally.

This is, in sum, a rich if uneven collection that makes a welcome addition to what is now a well-established and rewarding domain of practical normative theory.