Productive Evolution: On Reconciling Evolution with Intelligent Design

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Nicholas Rescher, Productive Evolution: On Reconciling Evolution with Intelligent Design, Ontos, 2011, 127pp., $79.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381245.

Reviewed by Bruce H. Weber, California State University Fullerton and Bennington College


In this volume Nicholas Rescher addresses the conceptual issues raised by the public discourse about evolutionary theory and intelligent design. In the preface he makes his central claim that "evolutionary adaptation can result in solutions that intelligence could ratify." He states his goal as the naturalization of intelligent design and concludes that "nothing prevents theology from seeing evolution as an acceptable process in a divinely ordained world order." In the succeeding nine chapters Rescher makes his argument at a very general and abstract level rather than engaging the specific arguments of the participants of the current debates on the relative validity of the contrasting explanations of biological organization and order offered by evolutionists or intelligent design theorists.[1]

In the first chapter, Rescher characterizes evolution as a developmental process that operates at different levels -- cosmic, biological, and cultural -- each with its distinctive selective principle -- processual, natural, or rational. That evolution can occur at various levels is a claim often made,[2] but that it is fundamentally a developmental process is problematic. Rescher cites as his authority for this D'Arcy Wentworth Thompson's book Growth and Form, but does not address the rather extensive current literature on this question. Rescher's view of evolution as a developmental process is the crucial conceptual move in his argument; I will assess this assumption after following how he cashes it out. Rescher shifts the argument from one of evolution as development to a more perspicuous and plausible one that evolution is a series of emergent processes at various hierarchical levels. From this emergentist perspective, "The emergence of new phenomena at different levels of scale and organizational complexity in nature means the emergence of new processes and laws at these levels." (p. 7) For example, he argues that Darwin's account of the evolution of the human mind is deficient since it does not leave room for intentionality, thus excluding meaning and purpose from human action. "The physical rootedness of an activity or process does not restrict or circumscribe its function and character." (p. 7) Mind emerges from brain but instantiates new phenomena, and with the new phenomena emerge new principles of variation and selection. Culture emerges from minds and displays a process of rational selection. "With the emergence of intelligence, rational selection takes over." (p. 8)

To Rescher this means, as he explains in chapter 2, that humans evolved to fill the putative ecological niche of intelligence. The particular way human intelligence emerged meant that there was excess capacity, probably needed in times of stress, for new and extra creative activities.

In chapter 3, Rescher stresses that this excess mental capacity allows for humans to be "amphibians" living both in the physical world and in one of mental activity. Humans live in two worlds, one of experienced reality and one of fancy and imagination. Imagination is an evolutionary endowment that allows humans to explore potential actions and to choose futures accordingly. From this endowment emerges culture, a phenomenon with its own dynamics and selective principles that he explores in chapter 4. For Rescher, culture and cultural evolution, unlike biological evolution, are teleological in nature. The scientific community in particular exemplifies this type of evolution. Rescher points out in chapter 5 that the institutional ground rules of the scientific community can be understood as an instantiation of the rational selection of teleologically successful and functionally cost-effective practices, such as information sharing, open publication, fair credit system, and vigorous intolerance of misbehavior such as plagiarism, data forging, or other dishonesty. Scientific practice reconciles self-interest with cooperation and collaboration.

Rescher, in chapter 6, extends his argument to include free will, which, along with intelligence, he sees as an evolutionary emergence. He raises the question as to whether the mind responds passively to brain-state changes or actively uses brain-state changes for its own ends: "the brain/mind is seen as an emergently evolved dual aspect organization whose two interlinked domains permit that the impetus to change lies sometimes on the one side and sometimes on the other." (p. 65) Rather than a rigid materialism or rigid idealism, a more realistic "theory of mind-matter coordination . . . sees the two as reciprocally conjoined functioning expressive of different facets of complex, two sided interaction" (p. 69). As Rescher points out, this leads to Kant's paradox of reconciling the two modes of causality (agency and nature), the resolution of which lies in the coordination of two inseparable aspects of one comprehensive causal process.

In the seventh chapter Rescher addresses the implications of the argument he has been developing for the contrasting explanations of evolution and intelligent design in which evolution is conceived as an instrumentality of intelligent design. However, "Intelligent design is not the moving cause of evolutionary development but rather its consequence." (p. 75) Here Rescher draws the key distinction between being intelligently designed and being designed by intelligence, the difference between having the appearance ("as if") of intelligent design and being the artifact of an intelligent designer. Rescher's claim is that to view natural processes as rational is not to personify nature but rather to naturalize intelligence. Nature must be regular enough that living beings can detect regularities in their environments and thus have a selective value for intelligence. This implies a central role for information and for learning, a role, which Rescher notes, was suggested by James Mark Baldwin.

Intelligent Design Theory, in contrast, assumes an intelligent agent of some sort, perhaps a deity, because it assumes that natural selection cannot produce intelligent agents. "Being intelligently designed no more requires an intelligent designer than being designed awkwardly requires an awkward one. Being intelligently designed is a descriptive feature of the product, not a claim about the producer in the mode of production" (pp. 84-5). Rescher admits that his position reflects an updated neo-Platonism though he contends that this position still has potential relevance. But he contends that his emphasis on emergence is not reductive because although the emergence of novelty may arise from lower-level interactions, the new phenomena are not explained by the lower-level but rather by the function of the higher level. "The sort of evolution at issue is emergentist. It brings into existence new forms of being which carry emergently new modes of process in their wake." (p. 88)

In the final two chapters Rescher responds to possible theological and scientific objections to his argument. If there is the appearance of teleology in the universe we have to explain it as the result of natural or of supernatural causes in one of the following ways: (1) the universe is the result of the creative agency of an intelligent being; (2) the universe is one of a very large array of possible universes in a multiverse (randomly produced simultaneously or sequentially) in which the one we inhabit just happens to be "just right" and has the appearance of design; or (3) "The same sort of developmental selective processes that make for the emergence of intelligent beings IN the universe make for the emergence of intelligent design OF the universe." (p. 90) The first and third possibilities are compatible with each other but not with the second. The claim that the universe exhibits the appearance of design is theologically neutral, but there are objections that design, as the result of evolutionary processes, are theologically problematic because of the slowness of the process, as well as its wastage and cruelty, particularly for living beings. Not surprisingly these are the theological problems of evil and theodicy.

But, with Darwin, Rescher sees evolution as fundamentally a creative process. For Rescher, emergence has brought forth, at the human level, intelligence, linguistic communication, symbolic information processing, reasoning, questioning, imagination, self-apprehension, empathy, love, valuing, and spiritual insight, which are all of theological value. While admitting that evolution is not purposive, Rescher sees it as directional, geared to the production of intelligent beings, "For intelligence is the most efficient and effective of survival strategies." (p. 96) Whether this is so remains to be seen. At the same time Rescher admits that there are scientific objections to intelligent design theory rooted in its supernaturalism and unrealism. In response he argues that his position on apparent design is that it is the result of natural processes and so does not require divine intervention, although he would allow that such processes could reflect the intention of the deity. Given that the world is complex and seems to become more complex over time, there are inherent limits to the perfectibility of the world due to the inherent interconnectedness of the networks that make up the world. The world we have is a package deal, and though emergence allows for new phenomena its component systems can at best optimize but not maximize their properties. Rescher concludes that accepting a naturalized intelligent design does not require theology, though it does create a conceptual space for the possibility of theism.

To the extent that Rescher conceives of evolutionary processes as natural ones characterized by the emergence of new forms and phenomena he is consistent with current scientific and philosophical thinking about these matters, particularly with the growing literature about emergent complexity, especially by authors such as Stuart Kauffman, Philip Clayton, and Terrence Deacon.[3] Rescher makes the logical case for the importance of having a focus on emergence but his argument lacks the specifics that these authors provide. It is a characteristic of emergence in complex systems that once a new level of structures and phenomena emerge that new niches and new evolutionary pathways become available and are explored over time. Such processes may appear to be developmental but are not so in the sense that embryos develop. The evolution, or unfolding, is not programmed but reflects a complex process of interactions and is much more open-ended than that seen in biological development, and hence it has greater potential fecundity. The broad sweep of evolutionary phenomena, from cosmos to mind and culture that Rescher addresses, may appear to be designed or to be developmental, but are more perspicuously perceived as the result of natural and emergent processes. There can be grandeur in this view, as well as room for philosophical and theological speculation.

[1] Only Richard Dawkins, The Blind Watchmaker (New York: Norton, 1985), is cited among evolutionists, with no mention of other seminal references, such as Stephen Gould, The Structure of Evolutionary Theory (Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press, 2002), or Sean Carroll, Endless Forms Most Beautiful: The New Science of Evo-Devo (New York: Norton, 2005); however, he does cite Robert Byrd and Peter Richardson, Culture and the Evolutionary Process (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1980), on cultural evolution. Nor is there any citation or dealing with the specific arguments of contemporary intelligent design theorists such as Michael Behe, Darwin's Black Box: The Biochemical Challenge to Evolution (New York: Free Press, 1996), William Dembski,The Design Inference (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1998), or Stephen Meyer, Signature in the Cell: DNA and the Evidence for Intelligent Design (New York: Harper Collins, 2009).

[2] See for example Gould (2002) cited in note 1 and also David Depew and Bruce Weber, Darwinism Evolving: Systems Dynamics and the Genealogy of Natural Selection (Cambridge MA: MIT Press, 1995).

[3] See references in note 2. Also, on the subject of emergence see Stuart Kauffman, Investigations (New York: Oxford University Press, 2000); Philip Clayton, Mind & Emergence: From Quantum to Consciousness (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2004); Philip Clayton and Paul Davies, The Re-Emergence of Emergence of Emergence (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2006); Terrence Deacon, Incomplete Nature: How Mind Emerged from Matter (New York: Norton, 2012).