Prolegomena to Any Future Materialism, Volume One: The Outcome of Contemporary French Philosophy

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Adrian Johnston, Prolegomena to Any Future Materialism, Volume One: The Outcome of Contemporary French Philosophy, Northwestern University Press, 2013, 257pp., $45.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780810129122.

Reviewed by Jeffrey A. Bell, Southeastern Louisiana University


In this first of a projected three-volume Prolegomena to Any Future Materialism, Adrian Johnston places his materialist philosophy into the lineage of contemporary French philosophy. The French philosophers Johnston has most in mind are Jacques Lacan, Alain Badiou, and Quentin Meillassoux, and each of them fails, on Johnston’s reading, despite professed intentions to the contrary, to develop a thoroughly materialist philosophy. In one way or another, each ultimately “backslides” into a form of religious thinking that is also coupled with an under-appreciation of, if not outright hostility to, the life sciences. It is precisely by developing the philosophical implications of recent developments in the life sciences, and in particular the neurosciences (on this point Johnston follows Catherine Malabou), that a proper materialist philosophy can be established without backsliding into quasi-religious explanations.

Johnston’s focus upon the work of Lacan and his disciples is not simply to lay out a critical exegesis but rather to fulfill the promise of a materialist philosophy that can only be accomplished, Johnston argues, if one properly harnesses Lacan’s central insight -- namely, the idea that the real entails an irreducible gap or rupture. By contrast, a common metaphysical assumption that is shared by both naïve scientific materialism and religious theism, Johnston argues, is the notion that Nature/God is an inviolable “One-All.” As he puts it, “It is not much of a leap to propose that the scientism accompanying modern natural science as a whole . . . tends to be inclined to embrace the nonempirical supposition of the ultimate cohesion of the material universe as a self-consistent One-All.” (16) From here Johnston seconds Lacan’s “assertion that science, even in the current era, relies upon ‘the idea of God’”. (16). If one aligns one’s metaphysical views of materialism with contemporary life sciences, however, Johnston claims that we no longer have the “big Other,” the “self-consistent One-All” that provides the metaphysical foundation for science; to the contrary, “what remains,” Johnston argues, “lacks any guarantee of consistency right down to the bedrock of ontological fundaments.” (23). Instead of a material being that is a consistent One-All and a continuation of the “idea of God,” we have “antagonisms and oppositions at the very heart of material being.” (24). It is only by way of such “antagonisms and oppositions,” Johnston claims, that we are able to offer a nonreductive yet materialist account of the emergence of conscious subjectivity. Key to this effort is the development of the concept of weak nature, a concept that Johnston derives from Hume’s project (of which more below) and which will become the central topic of the second volume of Johnston’s Prolegomena, titled Weak Nature. To set the stage for the necessity of formulating the concept of weak nature, Johnston first lays out the inadequacies of Lacan’s, Badiou’s, and Meillassoux’s efforts to follow through on their intention to establish a materialist philosophy. Due to the constraints of space, I will simply sketch the problems Johnston has with these efforts, highlighting along the way some potential problems and oversights with Johnston’s own approach.

Despite what Johnston takes to be Lacan’s correct insight regarding the common metaphysical assumptions regarding the “One-All” in both science and religion, Lacan’s thought itself, Johnston argues, is “clouded by occasional bouts of backsliding into dangerous flirtations with Catholicism and a virulent hostility to the life sciences.” (4). There are two places where this clouding becomes especially evident. The first occurs with respect to what Johnston sees as Lacan’s outdated view of science. He claims that Lacan’s understanding of science relies upon an “odd materialism” that rules out on principle any account of how the natural body may be “exogenously impacted and subjectified by the denaturalizing signifiers of the sociosymbolic orders.” (50) This then leads to Lacan’s claim that “language is there before man . . . Not only is man born in language, exactly as he is born into the world, but he is born by language,” (63) and as a result Lacan admits to having no interest in “prehistory” (63), for such a history would entail moving beyond the symbolic order, a move that would have to occur by way of the symbolic order. This is the second place where Lacan encounters difficulties according to Johnston, for he falls into what Meillassoux will call the correlational circle -- namely, the circle whereby the real is always the real as correlated with a subject for whom it is given, and hence we are never given the real as it is in itself. In the case of Lacan we have what Johnston calls “a structural linguistic correlationist for whom the pre-Symbolic . . . Real exists solely in and through a (co)constituting correlation with the Symbolic.” (69). It is here where the “One-All” and the “idea of God” resurfaces in Lacan’s thought, for the “One-All” is the Symbolic order of language itself. Lacan, in other words, did not remain true to his initial insight regarding the need for discontinuities, gaps, and ruptures at the heart of the real. Johnston then turns to Lacan’s disciples to see if they fare any better in developing a materialist philosophy.

Before turning to Badiou a brief comment is in order. It is certainly natural to see Badiou, Meillassoux, and others (most notably, Žižek) as Lacan’s primary disciples carrying forward the master’s central insights, and yet Johnston pays little attention to the work of Gilles Deleuze in his book. As Daniel Smith reminds us in his essay on Lacan, when Deleuze recounted a meeting he had with Lacan not long after the publication of Anti-Oedipus, he claimed that after having gone through “a list of all his disciples,” whom Lacan said were all “worthless,” Lacan concluded that when it came to disciples he needed “someone like you [Deleuze].”[1] In particular, in Anti-Oedipus Deleuze and Guattari explicitly wonder “How many interpretations of Lacanianism [are] overtly or secretly pious, [and] have in this manner invoked . . . a gap in the Symbolic? . . . Despite some fine books by certain disciples of Lacan, we wonder if Lacan’s thought really goes in this direction.”[2] The reason for Lacan’s hesitation to move in this direction, as Deleuze and Guattari put it in What is Philosophy?, is precisely Lacan’s effort to develop an immanent materialism and avoid a transcendence of the gap or rupture whereby “immanence is [taken to be] a prison from which the Transcendent [breach or rupture] will save us.”[3] In other words, remaining true to Lacan’s efforts to avoid a return of the “secretly pious” and theological would entail avoiding this form of transcendence. I will return to this theme below, but for Žižek and Badiou, at least, developing Lacan’s thought does entail affirming the breach or rupture and a rejection of Deleuze, who is mistakenly assumed to be continuing with the very metaphysics of the One-All that has been a hindrance to developing a proper materialism.

Johnston’s view, however, is more sophisticated, and one of the great strengths of his book is the attention he draws to the premise that motivates Badiou’s turn to formal mathematics in developing an ontology of events. As Johnston puts it, “Badiou depicts naturalism-organicism-vitalism, on the one hand, and formalism-mathematicism, on the other hand, as mutually exclusive ontological options.” (85) Badiou adopts the latter approach and rejects the former; and since Deleuze is associated with the former approach, his thought is rejected as well. Johnston, however, will call into question Badiou’s “reasons for rejecting the naturalism-organicism-vitalism option.” (85) Put briefly, for Johnston the choice is not between formalism and vitalism but rather “between spiritualist obscurantism and scientific clarity,” (98) and Johnston argues that, unfortunately for Badiou’s project, Badiou falls decidedly on the side of “spiritualist obscurantism.”

Badiou’s slip into “spiritualist obscurantism” occurs when he attempts to account for the process whereby an “inconsistent multiplicity” becomes a “consistent multiplicity.” An inconsistent multiplicity is a consequence of Cantor’s theory of transfinite numbers, which entails, as Johnston puts it, an uncountable, nondenumerable “infinite infinities of inconsistent multiplicities-without-oneness.” (111) The “counting-for-one” operation “imposes certain constraints and limitations on thought’s relation to (inconsistent) multiplicities of being per se,” (115) and renders them into countable, consistent multiplicities. The problem for Badiou, however, is to account for this operation itself. Who or what performs the operation? Johnston claims that ultimately this “counting-for-one” remains unaccounted for, and is “a unity-producing synthesizing function or process as an ephemeral non-being arising from God-knows-where.” (128) Despite his efforts to avoid Kantian idealism, it “remains just around the corner” (128) in Badiou’s own thought.

Johnston next turns to Meillassoux, a move that is crucial, for not only was Meillassoux Badiou’s student, but Badiou himself calls upon Meillassoux’s book, After Finitude, to do the heavy lifting in decoupling a transcendental philosophy from Kantian transcendental idealism. Since Badiou was unsuccessful in carrying out this decoupling, the turn to Meillassoux becomes all the more important, or as Johnston argues, “whether Badiou succeeds in entirely stepping out from under Kant’s long shadow arguably depends on whether Meillassoux succeeds in thoroughly debunking Kantian and post-Kantian correlationism.” (132)

Central to Meillassoux’s effort to establish what he calls a speculative materialism is an appropriation and transformation of Hume’s philosophy, or more precisely the “core maneuver,” Johnston argues, “lying at the very heart of Meillassoux’s project is an ontologization of Hume’s epistemology.” (150). Johnston argues quite convincingly that this maneuver fails. In particular, he disputes Meillassoux’s use of the chance/contingency distinction. Chance refers to the calculation of probabilities relative to a One-All set of possibilities, and thus for instance the chance a flipped coin will show up heads approaches 50% as the number of throws approaches infinity, the infinite One-All set of throws. Contingency, on the other hand, is what one has when one adopts Cantor’s “unbounded infinite of multiplicities-without-limits”, for then one undoes the very One-All totality “upon which the probabilistic aleatory reasoning of chance allegedly depends, namely, the presumed existence of a totality of possible outcomes.” (163).

The problem for this view, however, is to account for stability at all, a stability Meillassoux himself relies upon when he calls upon the findings of science (e.g., carbon dating) to argue for what he calls arche-facts, or the fact that there were realities that pre-date being given to any consciousness (and hence a reality beyond and irreducible to any form of correlationism). If anything, Johnston argues, the ontology Meillassoux draws from Cantor, what Meillassoux calls “hyper-chaos,” makes it less rather than more likely that stability would emerge at all. “Why,” Johnston asks, “should the detotalization of the totality posited in connection with chance . . . make the flux of inconstancy less rather than more likely?” (163) If there are infinite infinities of hyper-chaos, and if anything can emerge at any time without any reason or explanation (for such a reason or explanation depends upon a stability of relationships), then Meillassoux himself ultimately ends up falling into “spiritualist obscurantism” rather than offering, as Johnston seeks to do, a position grounded in “scientific clarity.” For instance, Johnston points out that Meillassoux simply accepts without explanation or reasons a conscious subjectivity. In other words, Meillassoux is completely immune to the “hard problem” as has been formulated in the work of David Chalmers. This immunity is not a virtue, however, but rather a crippling vice that infects Meillassoux’s entire project. If anything can emerge at any time without reason or explanation, then what Meillassoux leaves us with, Johnston claims, “amounts to an antiscientific sophistical sleight-of-hand that places Meillassoux in undeniable proximity to the same Christian creationists he mocks in After Finitude.” (152-3).

In the final section, the Postface, Johnston sets the stage for the two volumes that will follow through on the promise to offer a materialism that does not reproduce the “idea of God” in any form. As with Meillassoux, Hume looms large in Johnston’s efforts. Instead of offering an ontologization of Hume’s epistemology that leads to a Cantorian metaphysics of hyper-chaos, Johnston offers an ontologization of Hume’s skepticism that lays the basis for the concept of weak nature. With this concept in hand, Johnston believes he will be able to offer, in subsequent volumes, a proper materialist philosophy, what he calls “transcendental materialism” and takes to be the position that “affirms the immanence to material nature of subjects nonetheless irreducible to such natural materialities.” (178) Integral to transcendental materialism is the idea that “splits [are] real and ineliminable.” (180) Transcendental materialism is to be contrasted with “Hegelian-Marxian dialectical materialism” in that whereas the former sees splits as “real and ineliminable,” dialectical materialism “favors emphasizing eventual unifying syntheses of such apparent splits as that between, simply put, mind and matter.” (180). The concept of weak nature provides a way of incorporating the ineliminability of splits in that it assumes Hume’s skeptical arguments have successfully weakened “the appearance of humans as free, as capriciously spontaneous” and weakened “the appearance of nature as determined, as ruled without exception.” (207) What this “ontological weakening of nature” leaves us with, Johnston concludes, is an “opening within being qua being an sich [of] the possibility of a gap,” a gap that makes possible “a subjectivity fully within but nonetheless free at certain levels from material nature.” (209)

In closing I return to my earlier point regarding Deleuze’s claim that a proper Lacanian metaphysics would not embrace ineliminable splits, for in doing so one ineluctably brings the transcendent in through the back door, and this in turn threatens to undermine the transcendental materialism Johnston hopes to establish. These questions may be addressed in the second volume, Weak Nature, and Johnston may well take on some of the Deleuzian questions raised here. To do so would make sense, for in many ways Deleuze and Johnston are fellow travelers in that their interest in Hume was motivated precisely by the problematic that leads Johnston to propose the concept of weak nature -- that is, it provides for an account of a subjectivity that is “fully within but nonetheless free at certain levels from material nature.” (209) As Deleuze states the Humean problematic in Empiricism and Subjectivity, it is, as for Johnston, to show how a “subject transcending the given [can] be constituted in the given?”[4] Much of the rest of Empiricism and Subjectivity, and much of Deleuze’s subsequent work, can be understood in the light of this problematic. Whether or not Johnston addresses these questions in the next volume, he has certainly shown that a Humean metaphysics of weak nature offers a promising way forward in establishing a materialist philosophy. Johnston’s subsequent volumes promise to offer a significant contribution to debates in contemporary philosophy and will be eagerly anticipated.

[1] Daniel Smith, “The Inverse Side of the Structure: Žižek on Deleuze on Lacan,” in Essays on Deleuze (Edinburgh: Edinburgh University Press, 2012), p. 312.

[2] Ibid. p. 317.

[3] Gilles Deleuze and Felix Guattari, What is Philosophy?, translated by Hugh Tomlinson and Graham Burchell (New York: Columbia University Press, 1994), p. 47.

[4] Gilles Deleuze, Empiricism and Subjectivity, translated by Constantin Boundas (New York: Columbia University Press, 1991), p. 83.