Promises and Agreements: Philosophical Essays

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Hanoch Sheinman (ed.), Promises and Agreements: Philosophical Essays, Oxford University Press, 2011, 409pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195377958.

Reviewed by Allen Habib, University of Calgary


Promises and promissory obligations are hardy philosophical perennials. While rarely the sole focus of extended philosophical treatment, it's difficult to find an important commentator in the history of ethical theory that hasn't given them some at least some attention. From Plato to Kant, from Hume to Rawls, everyone has something to say about the nature of promissory obligation.

The past quarter century or so has seen something of a vogue in work on promising. Since the early 1990s we have seen significant contributions by Joseph Raz, Judith Thomson, Margaret Gilbert, Tim Scanlon, Stephen Darwall and many others. This makes Promises and Agreements: Philosophical Essays quite timely. And despite the traditional attention and the current popularity, this is the only collection of original essays on the nature of promising in print today. As such, it will be the obvious choice for those looking for a roundup of contemporary work in the field, whether for pedagogical or research purposes.

Luckily, the volume is up to the task of standard bearing, containing as it does an excellent sample of the best and most innovative contemporary authors, and contributing to many of the traditional and recent debates in the field, as well as breaking some new paths. The collection contains fifteen original pieces, along with a substantial introduction by the editor. Included are many of the more prominent voices in the field today: Darwall, David Owens, Gilbert, Julia Driver, Michael Smith, Alastair Norcross, Daniel Friedrich and Nicholas Southwood. There is a lack of diversity (only three women, only one author from outside of the Anglo-American community) and some notable lacunae, but overall the collection is very representative of the current state of the art. I don't have space here for a comprehensive review of all of the pieces, so I will instead limit myself to brief synopses and end with some brief remarks on the text as a whole.

As Sheinman notes in the preface, work on promissory theory is quite diverse and resists easy sorting. But the centre of the enquiry has always been the search for a satisfactory theory of promissory obligation, and the corpus generally reflects this concern. One traditional approach has been to appeal to the practice or convention of promising as the ground and source of promissory obligations. This is the path taken by Hume and Rawls. The contributions of Owens and Stan Husi advance this debate.

Owens argues in his piece, "The Problem with Promising", that what adherents of the practice view generally hold, namely, that a practice of promising or something very like it is necessary for vital social coordination (what Owens calls the 'social coordination hypothesis'), can't ground the further claim that practice views must make, that promising only makes sense in light of a practice. By contrast, Stan Husi argues in his essay, "Is Promising a Practice and Nothing More?" that practice views need not reach beyond the borders of the practice for a grounding of promissory obligations, but rather can content themselves with the sort of intra-practice norms that help to structure games and social conventions.

Another traditional answer to the puzzle of promissory obligations is what are called 'expectation' or 'trust' views. These are theories that explain the obligation to keep a promise as grounded in the expectations of the promisee that it will be kept. There are several varieties of such views: some (e.g., Thomson's) requiring actual reliance on the promise by the promisee, in the manner of the legal doctrine of consideration; others (e.g., Scanlon's) requiring that the promise function so as to 'assure' the promisee of performance; and still others requiring only the trust of the promisee. In their piece, "Promises and Trust", Friedrich and Southwood rehearse their sophisticated trust view. The theory is that promising is a matter of 'inviting' the trust of the promisee, and that the wrong of promise breaking is the betrayal of that trust. They argue that their view can overcome some typical difficulties. For example, since merely 'inviting' the trust of the promisee is sufficient to incur the obligation, the promisee needn't actually come to trust the promise for the obligation to attach.

In the last few years a new sort of theory of promissory obligations has emerged. This approach makes promissory obligations out to be one of a number of sui generis obligations (and other normative phenomena) that arise from interpersonal exchange. The two pre-eminent views are those of Darwall and Gilbert, and both are represented here. Gilbert's theory, sketched in her "Three Dogmas about Promising", makes promissory obligations a matter of ''joint commitment'', a commitment composed of (at least) two personal commitments, which are in turn commitments undertaken by ''an exercise of the will''. Joint commitments are undertaken when the parties make plain to one another their desires to so undertake, and as a result both are bound to ''conform'' to the commitment. The category includes all manner of mutual arrangements, from explicit contracts to informal agreements (e.g., the agreement to take a walk together). Gilbert frames this view in terms of its breaking with the titular three dogmas of promissory obligation: that such obligations are moral in character, that they are not merely willed into existence and that they have no force if the promised act is immoral. By contrast, Gilbert's 'joint commitments' aren't (necessarily) moral, are explicitly willed into existence and can effect their normative force even in cases where the promised act is morally forbidden.

Darwall's view makes promissory obligations out to be a species of what he has called 'second-personal' normative phenomena. Second-personal phenomena are many and varied, and Darwall places promises in the category of 'transactions', which is a group including contracts and other mutual arrangements, in which the basic second-personal authority (i.e., the power we have to 'make claims and demands on one another') generates obligations to perform what is outlined in the transaction. This second-personal authority is in turn a normative basic, and Darwall argues that this sort of authority is necessarily assumed in all cases of agreement. In contrast with Gilbert, Darwall assumes that transactions can engender obligations without an explicit 'agreement', as in the case of accepting an invitation. As well, Darwall's second-personal authority story gives rise to explicitly moral obligations through the mechanism of contractualism: roughly, the sort of authority we have to enter agreements is the sort necessary to ground a hypothetical contractualism of the Scanlonian sort.

Moving beyond theories of promissory obligations proper, another traditional debate centres on the ability of consequentialist theories of morality, and in particular varieties of utilitarianism, to handle promissory obligation. This has been a thorn in the side of utilitarians since at least the criticism of W.D. Ross in the 1930s, and for obvious reasons. If we take it (as most do) that keeping a promise is mandated even in cases where doing so results in lower utility overall than would be obtained on breaking it, then it would seem that promising is in direct tension with at least simple forms of consequentialism. Smith, Norcross and Brad Hooker all carry the banner here.

Smith's "The Value of Making and Keeping Promises" argues that a sophisticated consequentialism could recognize a unique moral value in making and keeping promises. This value is agent-relative, and Smith offers an argument for the possibility of such things on a consequentialist account, and thus the possibility of accounting for promissory obligations. Smith ends by claiming that the reasoning Scanlon invokes for valuing promises (agents wanting to meet the reasonable expectations they knowingly create) are more compatible with a consequentialist theory (fortified by relative values) than Scanlon's own contractualism.

Hooker offers his contemporary version of rule-consequentialism as capable of accounting for promissory obligations. In his frankly-named "Promises and Rule-Consequentialism", he first surveys the alternative approaches, including the Rawlsian practice account, varieties of the expectation account and act-consequentialism. Hooker then adduces the deontological features of promissory obligations (they are non-welfarist, voluntarily assumed, backward looking, embody agent-relative values and have correlative rights in the promisee, who in turn would be wronged by their breach), and argues that rule consequentialism is the theory best equipped to account for all of these.

Norcross calls his essay "Act-utilitarianism and Promissory Obligation", and in it he argues that, despite the tradition of criticism, act-utilitarianism is capable of accounting for promissory obligations. Norcross offers a variety of different arguments, almost all negative rebuttals of criticisms of act utilitarianism in this area. He argues that the central intuitive deliverance (that promises ought to be kept even if the results are sub-optimal) that informs the traditional critiques is typically under-described, and that attempting to fill it out sufficiently to critique it leads to doubts about its viability. He also takes on the claim that utilitarians have 'one thought too many', or are improperly motivated in their desire to keep their promises. But the most interesting arguments are those Norcross offers in defence of a Railton-inspired 'indirect' utilitarianism, i.e., one that works best if it is not adopted as a decision procedure by (many? most?) reasoning agents. Here Norcross argues both that such indirect utilitarianism is the better theory if it gets one closer to the maximization of utility, and that there is nothing intrinsically wrong with such a 'self-effacing' view, and in particular that such a view does not entail self-deception.

Further on the consequentialist front, David Phillips argues in his contribution, "Sidgwick on Promises", that Sidgwick's attempt to meet the challenge of promissory obligations on his consequentialist view doesn't work. Sidgwick's gambit is to deny the claim that promises are obligatory on grounds that it isn't 'self-evident'. Phillips argues that Sidgwick's test of self-evidence is so stringent that even his own consequentialist moral principles can't meet it, and that relaxing the strictures on self-evidence to accommodate Sidgwick's consequentalist principles opens the door to Ross-style deontological principles as well.

Another category of work on promises concerns what we might call promissory phenomena, that is, particular types or parts of promises and promissory arrangements that present their own puzzles. The contributions of Driver, Connie Rosati, Eric Chwang and Daniel Markovits fall into this class. Driver's essay concerns promises that are impossible to fulfill, and she seeks to distinguish incompatible promises, that is, promises made by one agent that are mutually incompossible, from other impossible promises. She invokes the distinction between pro tanto obligations, which are obligations that retain their normative force even when they are overridden by other considerations, and prima facie obligations, which are obligations that disappear if they are in tension with a more powerful normative force. Promises produce pro tanto obligations, argues Driver, and thus they retain their normative force even when they are made impossible to perform. This allows Driver to hold people accountable for promises they make that are in tension with one another, the paradigm example of which are the incompatible promises made by politicians in attempts to appease conflicting interest groups.

Chwang paper, "On Coerced Promises", takes up an issue that goes back to at least Hobbes. Hobbes' original sally, that such promises were in fact binding, sparked a debate that continues today. Some notable contributions to this debate (e.g., John Deigh's "Promises Under Fire") have championed Hobbes' counter-intuitive cause, but Chwang argues the other side, claiming not only that coerced promises carry no moral force, but also that by undermining the standard psychological etiology of promises, coercion removes the standard evidentiary value that promising behaviour might have concerning future actions, and so cannot be rationally relied upon to the degree that even a coerced direct action can be.

Rosati argues in her essay, "The Importance of Self-Promises", that, contrary to the traditional view, promises made to oneself aren't improper or degenerate cases of promises, but rather central and paradigmatic ones. Rosati counters what she takes to be the central problem with self-promises, that as the promisee, the agent who promises something to herself can release herself from the obligation, which flies in the face of our typical intuitions regarding the binding nature of promises. Rosati argues that the traditional 'promisee release condition', wherein a promisee can release a promiser from her obligation by simple fiat, isn't as simple as it seems, and that a closer examination of the phenomenon reveals that even in interpersonal cases it behooves us to say that promissory obligation is unarguably vitiated only when the promissory obligation is not independently grounded and either the obligation is trivial in import or, failing that, the promiser is released for a good reason. Rosati goes on to argue positively that self-promise is vindicated by our interest in exercising personal autonomy. In a twist on Owens's novel theory of promissory obligation, Rosati offers that it is our interests in being effective authorities over ourselves (as opposed to the promisee's interest in authority over the promiser) that grounds promises, both inter- and intra-personal.

Markovitz, in his "Promise as an Arm's-Length Relation", argues against what he calls the 'relational' view of promising, where the paradigm promise is embedded in an intimate relationship between promiser and promisee. Instead, Markovitz proposes that promises are inherently distancing, casting the promisee in Kantian-like terms of neutral personhood, with the obligation owed out of proper respect for such. Markovitz argues that this feature makes contracts between relatively distant parties the paradigm of promising, rather than, say, arrangements between friends.

Rounding out the collection are two pieces more explicitly about 'agreements': Yitzhak Benbaji's "Contractarianism and Emergency", a piece on just war theory that argues for a consequentialist account of the rules of war, and Sheinman's "Agreement as Joint Promise", which offers a theory of agreements that makes them out to be a 'joint action', but one composed of two simpler actions, namely, promises on the part of the agree-ants.

As a snapshot of the state of the art in research on promising, the text comes off very well. It mixes contemporary contributions to many traditional debates (practice and trust views, utilitarianism and promising, etc.) with a generous amount of entirely novel (and often quite provocative) explorations. I'm thinking here in particular of the pieces by Husi, Markovitz and Rosati. Their essays are refreshingly new and they offer the possibility of new paths of fruitful exploration. Rosati's piece I think is the most interesting, although I am a partisan of the view (and cited in the text), so that opinion may need some salt.

As a pedagogical text, the collection is also quite good, although it lacks explicit representatives of some of the standard views. It would serve well as a companion or further reading text for undergraduate courses, and as a primary text for graduate seminars. In particular, it has an outstanding collection of cutting-edge writing on consequentialism and promises, easily the best collection of such anywhere to date, so those teaching seminars in consequentialism and utilitarianism will also find it valuable.

If there's anything to complain about, it's the lack of certain topics and authors. Strangely, there are no pieces (explicitly) about promises and contracts. Although, to be fair, many pieces do have something to say about the relation. And of course I would have liked to have seen contributions from other important contemporary figures (Scanlon and Thomson, to name just two). But any text could be made better by addition. What's important is how good the text is on its own, and this one is excellent.