Property Possession as Identity: An Essay in Metaphysics

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Patrick X. Monaghan, Property Possession as Identity: An Essay in Metaphysics, Ontos, 2011, 191pp., $106.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381207.

Reviewed by Andrea Borghini, College of the Holy Cross, Worcester, MA


Patrick Monaghan's Property Possession as Identity is a courageous book that sketches the fundamental aspects of a novel theory of properties. The first chapter introduces the reader to the driving ideas and underlying motivations of the work. The next four chapters critically discuss both contemporary and classic accounts, including predicate/concept/class nominalism and the positions of Gonzalo Rodriguez-Pereyra, Edward Zalta, Donald Baxter, David Armstrong, and Plato. The last two chapters expand on the most original and controversial aspects of the theory, "an attempt to bring Plato's forms down from heaven to earth, and to bundle them together with each other in certain sorts of ways to form the sensible, changing things that we perceive around us on a daily basis." (p. 3)

Monaghan's main thesis -- as his title suggests -- is that "property possession and identity are like the Morning Star and the Evening Star: we used to think that they are two different things, but in reality they are just one." (p. 5) It may be unclear, at first sight, what sorts of identity claims are central to the theory. It seems Monaghan's idea is not that for each property possessed by x, x is identical with that property, but rather, that x is identical to that property which is x's nature. To exemplify: Napoleon is not identical with each of his properties; rather, Napoleon is identical with his own nature, a complex property containing all of Napoleon's properties as proper parts. Monaghan explains the notion of complex property as well as that of property possession in mereological terms. His choice, as we shall see, is problematic in a number of ways.

Although I will concentrate on Monaghan's positive view, his book is worth reading not only for its pars construens, but also for his profuse and often original critical analysis of extant theories of properties. Whether Monaghan's proposal can stand on its own merits, however, is unclear. Several portions of his project remain underdeveloped and what's in the text raises a number of issues, seven of which I will consider below.

1. Identity and Mereology

The first issue pertains to the attempt to explain the identity embedded in the theory by means of mereology. According to Monaghan's account, "to claim that x possesses y as a property is to claim that y is a certain part of x;" namely "y is the non-proper part of x to which x is numerically identical." (p. 10) It is unclear to what extent such an account helps in clarifying the relationship between a property and its bearer. While some authors (e.g., Laurie Paul and Alvin Plantinga) have recently shown sympathy for a theory explaining property possession in mereological terms, none has so far come close to claiming that properties are identical with their bearers. More importantly, in its most general scope mereology aims at providing a theory of parts that is not limited to spatio-temporal entities. Indeed, when parthood has been invoked to explain property possession, it has been interpreted as a non-spatial relation. In Monaghan's view, however, there are no non-spatial properties (p. 48), so the mereological relations through which identity is captured have to be spatial. Such limitation is problematic, as we shall see below in connection with causal change and complex properties.

2. Complex Properties

The use of  mereological machinery becomes even more suspicious when applied to complex properties. The latter include all the properties that are, mereologically speaking, non-atomic, that is, those properties that contain proper parts. Complex properties are used to make room for the existence of entities with a complex nature:

The nature of x is the more or less complex property possessed by x that is complete and total in the sense that it comprises as parts not only all of the properties that can be truly predicated of x, but also all of the properties that can be truly predicated of one of x's parts. (p. 10)

This theory of nature seems to require that some relations between properties are non-spatial. Consider a ball, which is perfectly spherical and homogeneously purple, and suppose that those two properties jointly exhaust the nature of the ball. Since they occupy the same spatial location, the complexity of the property cannot be accounted for in spatial terms. Two questions arise from this. First, it is unclear how this part of the theory can be combined with the denial of the existence of non-spatial properties (p. 48). Second, why should we think of a cluster of properties as composing one single complex property? For instance, why should all the properties inherent in Napoleon compose one single property, viz. Napoleon's nature? It is unclear what sort of criterion for the existence of properties Monaghan has in mind, since he seems committed to say that, for any complex nature, there is a corresponding property, as the following passage attests: "Given this definition, according to my account, for x to possess y as a property is for y to be the non-proper part of the nature of x to which that nature is identical, and for that nature to be the non-proper part of x to which x is identical" (p. 10)

3. Causal Change

Among the chief theoretical roles of properties is the explanation of causal change, and it is striking that Monaghan doesn't address this topic. In Section 4.5 (pp. 174-175), titled "My account and change," Monaghan discusses how his view can make room for the possibility of things changing despite the fact that properties are conceived mereologically and that mereological extensionalism holds. Aside from the fact that Monaghan does not provide a convincing argument for his position, more needs to be said about change. Consider, for instance, the following passage: "If we assume that these properties [of a red, rubber ball] are spatial particulars, it seems perfectly obvious to me that this color and shape are parts of each other, given that they perfectly spatially coincide with one another." (p.7) If the color, shape, and chemical formula of the ball are "part of each other," Monaghan should be able, however, to explain why they may occupy different causal roles: for instance, it is in virtue of its shape (and not of its color) that the ball rolls on a flat surface in a certain way.

4. Metaphysics and Semantics

Monaghan is among those philosophers for whom metaphysical structure cannot be read off semantic structure. He writes: "While the structure of predicate logic seems to imply that no property can ever be truly predicated of itself, this is not suggested by the grammar of ordinary English." (p. 24; see also pp. 170-174) At the same time, however, there is no clear-cut semantic picture of the metaphysical view that Monaghan is defending. If the semantics of ordinary language is not adequate to render the view, what sorts of principles govern the metaphysical landscape Monaghan is trying to portray? For instance, according to Monaghan: if we say that Napoleon is courageous, are we really saying that Napoleon is identical to courage? That Napoleon is identical to a complex property (a nature), which includes courage as a proper part? Until such a task has been accomplished, it seems that a judgment of Monaghan's view will have to be tentative.

5. Particulars and Generals

Monaghan claims to be uninterested in addressing the old, vexed problem of universals: "one problem with which I am not primarily concerned in this essay is the one traditionally referred to as the problem of the one over the many, or the problem of universals." (p. 29) Monaghan believes that -- before getting into the one over many problem -- a more basic question should be addressed: "this is the problem of what it is for a single entity to be qualitative in a single respect in the first place, e.g. what it is for a single entity to be red." (p. 29)

Now, while it is plausible that the problem of universals is more complex than (and hence subordinate to) the problem of property possession, the latter nonetheless requires a certain conception of particular and general entities. Monaghan's thesis, ultimately, seems to be that there is no genuine distinction between particular and general entities. Yet he presents no argument for this assumption, other than the claim that to possess a certain property means to be identical with it. But suppose that there are some indiscernible entities; then the distinction between a particular entity within such a collection and the general collection seems to be a relevant one. Now, take the (complex) property which is identical to one of the entities in the collection: it seems that such property is identical also with all other entities in the collection. Thus, the property would be located where all the entities in the collection are located. Most importantly, it would be multiply located where all such entities are located, a feature which Monaghan's account of identity in terms of mereology does not seem to allow.

6. Theory of Properties: Perception

Monaghan's view of properties is inspired by the empiricist tradition: "I claim that a property exists just in case it is perceivable." (p. 47) The examples discussed in the text, however, do not seem to address the most poignant reservations. These include not only mathematical and logical properties. Dollar bills, for instance, are identified with certain portions of paper; Pisum sativum with the plant whose seeds are green peas; masculine garments with (among others) full suits; to what extent do such identifications depend on what is perceivable? To prove that socially constructed properties depend upon perceivable features, rather than the other way round, a more thorough argument is needed. Needless to say, such an argument should prove that meaning derives from perceivable features of reality.

7. Fundamentality

The most perplexing aspect of the theory lies, perhaps unsurprisingly, in its very foundation: the idea that property possession is the identity relation. It is unclear whether such a foundation is adequate to play the required theoretical role. Without us knowing which properties do exist, whether they can repeat or not, we are told that -- in order to accommodate the complex nature of things -- some properties can be complex, that is, they may contain other properties as proper parts; why should we believe the last bit of the theory? If to say that Napoleon is courageous means to say that the property of being courageous is a proper part of the complex property that is identical with (the nature of) Napoleon, why should we believe that there is such a unique nature? Moreover, in what ways do properties influence each other? In what ways do we recognize a property as being of a certain kind? If perception is a necessary aspect for getting acquainted with properties, what is perception? The fundamental principle of the theory seems insufficient to ground, in one way or another, a host of key metaphysical issues that are directly related to it. Until Monaghan shows that the suggestedfundamentum is appropriately connected with the explanation of such issues, his view shall remain a courageous, yet in progress, theoretical attempt.[1]

[1] I am thankful to the journal editors for helpful comments on an earlier version of this review.