Propositional Content

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Peter Hanks, Propositional Content, Oxford University Press, 2015, 227pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199684892.

Reviewed by Andreas Stokke, Umeå University


In Propositional Content (PC) Peter Hanks defends a view of propositions as types of actions. Over the course of the nine chapters, Hanks develops and defends this view as it relates to central topics such as the unity of the proposition (chapter 2-3), the force-content distinction (chapter 4), proper names (chapter 5), empty names (chapter 6), propositional attitude reports (chapter 7), first-person propositions (chapter 8), and non-declarative speech acts such as asking and ordering (chapter 9). By taking on this wide range of topics, and by its clear style and strong sense of its direction and purpose, PC is a highly enjoyable and interesting contribution to the literature on the nature and role of propositions in philosophy. Moreover, by providing a detailed, book-length defense of the type-view of propositions, PC reinforces this way of thinking about propositions as a main contender in this area.

The core of Hanks's version of the type-view is the idea that simple judgments and assertions are acts of predicating properties of objects. To take an example Hanks uses throughout the book, if Obama judges or asserts that Clinton is eloquent, he predicates the property of eloquence of Clinton. Judging that Clinton is eloquent is a mental ("inner", p. 21) act of predication. Assertion is a spoken ("outer", p. 21) act of predication. When Obama performs any of these acts, he is tokening a type, namely the type of action of predicating eloquence of Clinton. For Hanks, that type is the proposition that Clinton is eloquent. Using Hanks's notation, the type of action that Obama is tokening when he judges or asserts that Clinton is eloquent is represented as (1).

(1)├ <Clinton, ELOQUENT>

In (1) "Clinton" is the type of action of referring to Clinton, "ELOQUENT" is the type of action of expressing the property of being eloquent, and the single turnstile "├ " is the type of action of predicating.

For Hanks, (1) is the proposition that Clinton is eloquent. Accordingly, Hanks thinks that (1) has truth-conditions. But Hanks rejects the common view that propositions are the primary bearers of truth-conditions. Instead, on Hanks's view, propositions (i.e., types) have truth-conditions because their tokens are true or false under particular conditions. For example, since tokens of (1) are true if and only if Clinton is eloquent, the proposition that Clinton is eloquent, that is, (1), is true if and only if Clinton is eloquent.

Moreover, Hanks holds that types such as (1) exist independently of their tokens. For Hanks, even if no one has ever predicated eloquence of Clinton, the proposition that Clinton is eloquent still exists. That is, the type of action that someone performs when they predicate eloquence of Clinton exists even if it has never been tokened. For similar reasons, proposition are, for Hanks, shareable and repeatable, since different subjects can token the same proposition.

Hanks also accepts the common idea that propositions are the contents of attitudes such as belief. To say that Obama believes that Clinton is eloquent is to say that Obama bears the belief-relation to the proposition that Clinton is eloquent, which is the type (1). Hence, for Hanks, propositional attitudes are tokening relations. Correspondingly, when someone reports Obama as believing that Clinton is eloquent, she predicates the belief-relation of Obama and the type of action represented by (1).

One of the substantial consequences of Hanks view is that it apparently amounts to a rejection of the distinction between force and content. Hanks distinguishes between two ways of understanding this distinction. According to what he calls the taxonomic version of the content-force distinction, it amounts to the claim that "speech acts with different forces all share the same propositional contents." (p. 9) Hanks discussion makes it clear that he takes this claim to pertain to sentence mood in a direct way. In particular, according to this way of understanding the content-force distinction, the claim is that the sentences in (2), although differing in mood, all have the same propositional content.

(2a) Declarative. Clinton is eloquent.

(2b) Interrogative. Is Clinton eloquent?

(2c) Imperative. Clinton, be eloquent!

According to the second, closely related, way of understanding the content-force distinction, as Hanks describes it, "there is nothing distinctively assertive about propositional contents." (p. 9) Hanks calls this the constitutive version of the content-force distinction.

For many, abandoning the taxonomic claim will be seen as less controversial than abandoning the constitutive claim. At least if taken as a view about the semantic values of (2a-c), the claim that they all share the same propositional content has been rejected by many, in particular in linguistics.[1] Hanks's view rejects the taxonomic claim by maintaining that "assertive, interrogative, and imperative speech acts have different kinds of propositions as contents, and these propositions are individuated using concepts of force." (p. 9)

According to this view, while (1) is the content of (2a), the interrogative (2b) and the imperative (2c) have as their contents the propositions (3) and (4), respectively.

(3a) ?<Clinton, ELOQUENT>

(3b) !<Clinton, ELOQUENT>

On Hanks's view (3a) is the type of action someone performs when they ask whether Clinton is eloquent. This proposition is distinct from (1). In particular, (3a) does not involve predicating the property of eloquence of Clinton. Hanks thinks that, like (1), (3a) does involve referring to Clinton and expressing the property of eloquence. Yet, on Hanks's view, instead of predicating this property of Clinton, "?" in (3a) represents an interrogative mode of combination. The analogous points apply to imperative propositions, like (3b).

As before, Hanks makes it clear that he takes this distinction between different propositions -- that is, on his view, different types of acts involving referring and expressing properties -- as tied up with the sentential moods exemplified in (2). As he says,

On this picture, sentential moods are semantically significant. The combinatory types found in propositions -- ├, ?, and ! -- are the contents of the declarative, interrogative, and imperative moods, respectively. The declarative mood is semantically associated with acts of predication, the interrogative mood with acts of asking, and the imperative mood with acts of ordering. (p. 31)

One issue that is relevant here, but which Hanks does not devote discussion to, is the phenomenon of indirect speech acts. At least since Searle (1979 [1975]) it has been standard to acknowledge that there is no one-one correspondence between sentence mood and speech act types. To take one of Searle's often cited examples, the interrogative in (4) can be used to issue a request.

(4) Can you reach the salt?

When used in the relevant way, an utterance of (4) is used to request that the addressee pass the salt.

On Hanks's view the content of (4) is an interrogative proposition, i.e., an interrogative type of action. Glossing over details, this interrogative proposition might be represented as in (5).


(5) is not the type of action that someone performs when they request that the addressee pass the salt. Rather, the natural way to represent this action, again simplifying, is as in (6).

(6) !<You, PASS-THE-SALT>

Readers of PC are likely to wonder whether Hanks's view can accommodate the datum that one can perform a token of (6) by uttering (4).

Hanks's view rules out at least one way of handling this problem. Namely, it rules out that, in the relevant cases, one performs only the indirect speech act. [2] For example, on Hanks's view, it is ruled out that, by uttering (4), one can perform a token of (6), while not performing a token of (5). Though there is no space here to consider this further, it is important to note that Hanks's view commits him to adopting an alternative strategy concerning indirect speech acts. In particular, there are two main alternatives. First, one can hold that, in cases of indirect speech acts, only the direct speech act is performed.[3] Second, one can hold that, in such cases, two speech acts are performed.[4] It is not implausible that Hanks could adopt (a version) of one of these ways of accounting for indirect speech acts, or perhaps some third option. Yet PC remains silent on this point.

According to what Hanks calls the "constitutive" component of the traditional content-force distinction, propositional content is free from force. This was the influential idea that Geach (1965) took from Frege (1997 [1918]). The claim that propositional content is free from force was motivated by the observation that, as Geach put it, "a proposition may occur in discourse now asserted, now unasserted, and yet be recognizably the same proposition" (Geach, 1965, 449) This happens in two main ways. First, in embeddings, e.g., in conditionals and conjunctions. For example, neither (7a) nor (7b) asserts that Clinton is eloquent.

(7a) Either Clinton is eloquent or Sanders will win.

(7b) If Clinton is eloquent, Sanders will lose.

Second, there are extra-linguistic factors that can have the same effect. For example, an actor who utters (2a) during a performance of a play does not assert that Clinton is eloquent.

Given that the content of (2a), on Hanks's view, is the proposition in (1), it might be hard to see how Hanks can accommodate the Frege-Geach point. To handle the phenomenon of declarative utterances that are not assertions, Hanks introduces the idea of a cancelation context. Hanks claims that the difference between Obama's assertion of (2a) and the actor's utterance of (2a) is that the latter is performed in a context with features that "cancel the normal requirements and consequences of acts of predication." (p. 94) As this suggests, Hanks thinks that both Obama and the actor perform acts of predicating eloquence of Clinton. As he says, "the actor does exactly the same sort of thing that Obama does when he asserts that Clinton is eloquent. Both the actor and Obama predicate the property of being eloquent of Clinton." (p. 94)

In other words, both Obama and the actor perform tokens of (1). Yet, Hanks also thinks that there is more to the type of action the actor performs. Namely it is performed in a cancelation context. Hanks notates this type of action as in (8).

(8) ~├ <Clinton, ELOQUENT>

(8) is the type of action someone performs when they predicate eloquence of Clinton in a cancelation context. Hanks further specifies that cancelation is not an act, and hence "~" is not a type of action. So while both the actor and Obama are performing tokens of (1), the difference is purely contextual, i.e., it is not a difference in the acts they perform.

It is worth asking how Hanks's view avoids appealing to the content-force distinction, or something equivalent to it, if both the actor and Obama perform tokens of (1). Since (1) is, for Hanks, the proposition that Clinton is eloquent, Hanks is committed to the view that one can token the proposition that Clinton is eloquent without asserting it. Yet one may wonder to what extent this is a departure from the content-force distinction, understood as the Frege-Geach point.

It is important to note that Hanks's view, on this point, is primarily a view about the nature of propositions. In particular, Hanks is adamant that the proposition (1) is not free from force, in the Frege-Geach sense. In other words, Hanks denies that it follows from the observation that one can utter a declarative without asserting it that propositions are free from force.

But to what extent are propositions bound up with force, on Hanks view? There is a sense in which, on Hanks's view, the type of action that is the proposition that p is the type of action someone performs when she asserts that p. Yet, since the actor performs a token of the same act as Obama, Hanks distinguishes the actor's act by saying that it is further characterized by occurring in a cancelation context. But then why not say that Obama's act is further characterized by occurring in a standard context? If so, then the turnstile will not be enough on its own to indicate assertoric force. We would need some way of indicating predication in the absence of cancelation, e.g., as in (9).

(9) +├ <Clinton, ELOQUENT>

Yet, at this point, we have reinstated the Frege-Geach claim that proposition are free from force, since the proposition (1) is now seen as needing either an addition of assertoric force (+) or of cancelation (~).

Hanks is, of course, aware of this potential problem. To avoid it, he appeals to an argument put forth by Dummett (1981). At its core the claim is that, as Hanks says,

there is nothing the actor can do to make his utterances count as genuine assertions. Even if he believes and endorses everything he says, takes himself to be manifesting his beliefs, intends to commit himself to the truth of his utterances, etc., he is still not performing genuine assertions . . . The actor can perform his own assertions only if he leaves the play behind and takes himself out of the theatrical context. (p. 93-94)

But while one may agree with this, it is at least not obvious how it supports the claim at hand. One can agree that the actor is not doing less than someone making genuine assertions. But it does not immediately follow that she is doing more. She is uttering declaratives in a particular kind of context. Hanks marks this by "~". But why not say something analogous of the asserter? She is uttering declaratives in a particular context. Why not mark this with "+"? Why not say that to assert is to perform a token of (1) in an assertoric context?

The discussion of the content-force distinction is merely part of the wide scope of PC. The book, in this way, is to be praised for raising a range of central questions, and for thoughtfully and clearly showing how the view of propositions as types of acts handles a host of issues. It should be a must-read for anyone interested in the nature of propositions. [5]


Bertolet, R. 1994. Are There Indirect Speech Acts? In S. Tsohatzidis (ed.) Foundations of Speech Act Theory: Philosophical and Linguistic Perspectives (London: Routledge), 335-349.

Dummett, M. 1981. Frege: Philosophy of Language. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.

Frege, G. 1997 [1918]. Thought. In M. Beany (ed.), The Frege Reader (Oxford: Blackwell), 325-345.

Geach, P.T. 1965. Assertion. The Philosophical Review, 74, 449-65.

Groenendijk, J. and Stokhof, M. 1984. Studies on the Semantics of Questions and the Pragmatics of Answers. Ph.D. thesis, University of Amsterdam.

Hamblin, C.L. 1973. Questions in Montague English. Foundations of Language, 10, 41-53.

Hausser, R. 1980. Surface Compositionality and the Semantics of Mood. In M. Bierwisch, F. Kiefer, and J. Searle (eds.) Speech Act Theory and Pragmatics (Dordrecht: Reidel), 71-96.

Karttunen, L. 1977. Syntax and Semantics of Questions. Linguistics and Philosophy, 1, 3-44.

Lepore, M. and Stone, M., 2015. Imagination and Convention: Distinguishing Grammar and Inference in Language, Oxford and New York: Oxford University Press.

Portner, P. 2004. The Semantics of Imperatives Within a Theory of Clause Types. In K. Watanabe and R.B. Young (eds.) Proceedings of SALT 14 (Ithaca, NY: CLC Publications), 235-52.

Portner, P. 2007. Imperatives and modals. Natural Language Semantics, 15, 351-383.

Searle, J. 1979 [1975]. Indirect speech acts. In Expression and meaning: Studies in the theory of speech acts, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 30-57.

[1] See, e.g., Hamblin (1973), Hausser (1980), Groenendijk and Stokhof (1984), Karttunen (1977), Portner (2004), (2007).

[2] Such a view has recently been adopted by Lepore and Stone (2015) for cases like (4).

[3] See, e.g., Bertolet (1994).

[4] See, e.g., Searle (1979 [1975]).

[5] Thanks to Peter Hanks (p.c.) for valuable discussion.