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Trenton Merricks, Propositions, Oxford University Press, 2015, 231pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732563.

Reviewed by Corine Besson, University of Sussex


Trenton Merricks' Propositions has two main goals. The first is to show that propositions exist. The second is to give an account of their fundamental features. The book addresses the issue of the nature of propositions mostly from a metaphysical perspective, although it also dwells on considerations to do with the philosophy of language, the philosophy of mind and, more importantly, the philosophy of logic.

The book is very clearly and effectively written, with an impressively tight and lucid argumentative structure. The view of propositions defended is original, as is the approach to defending it. It is very focused in its aims and scope; and there is very little by way of surveying the literature, contextualization or venturing into side issues. The book sticks straight to its aim, and given its consistently fast pace, it is best suited to a fairly specialized audience.

The first two chapters of the book are devoted to arguing for the existence of propositions. Chapters 3-5 are discussions and rejections of the two most mainstream rival accounts of propositions: that in terms of sets of possible worlds (Chapter 3) and that in terms of structured propositions (Chapter 4). Chapter 5 discusses singular propositions, and the last chapter, Chapter 6, outlines Merricks' own account.

The argument for the existence of propositions is original because it begins with considerations on the nature of validity, which are not a typical starting point in discussions over the existence of propositions. In Chapter 1, Merricks starts by arguing that there are what he calls 'modally valid arguments' and then he further argues that these arguments are made up of propositions: propositions are required to be the premises and conclusions of these modally valid arguments. Thus, since there are modally valid arguments, there are propositions too.

Once the existence of propositions has been established, Merricks gives an account of their fundamental features. They are as follows:

(i) propositions are abstract objects (p. 192-3);

(ii) propositions exist necessarily (p. 18-19);

(iii) propositions have their truth-conditions essentially (pp. 4-9);

(iv) propositions are the primary truth-bearers (pp. 22-4);

(v) propositions essentially 'represent things as being a certain way' (pp. 21-2);

(vi) propositions primitively represent things as being a certain way (pp. 194-9) -- 'there is no explanation of how a proposition manages to represent things as being a certain way' (p. xv).

According to him, further noticeable features of propositions are the following:

(vii) propositions are the objects of belief (p. 26);

(viii) propositions are not the objects of logic (pp. 40ff.);

(ix) propositions are not structured/do not have logical forms (pp. 45, 78);

(x) propositions do not have constituents (p. 205-7);

(xi) propositions are not sets (pp. 94ff);

(xii) there are singular propositions, i.e. propositions about singular objects (even about singular objects that do not exist) (p. 188);

(xiii) there is no real distinction between simple and complex propositions (p. 206).

Many features in this array are familiar and some are of course contentious, (vi) in particular. Merricks carefully tries to alleviate anxieties about a view on which nothing explains the fact that propositions represent things as being a certain way (Chapter 6). Even if you do not agree with the way in which Merricks argues for the existence of propositions, he has very compelling things to say about why standard explanations of how propositions (or any kind of entity) get to represent things as being a certain way are not satisfactory.

I cannot comment here in detail on all the aspects of this rich book. I will concentrate on three key issues:

(I) Merricks' argument for there being modally valid arguments;

(II) his argument for the constituents of modally valid arguments being propositions rather than sentences;

(III) his argument for propositions existing necessarily.

I. Logical versus modal validity

Merricks' claim that there are modally valid arguments is crucial to establishing not only the existence of propositions but also some of their fundamental features. According to him the best argument for the existence of propositions is that there are modally valid arguments and that propositions have to be the premises and conclusions of these arguments.

Here is my paraphrase of Merricks' key argument for the existence of modally valid arguments:

Consider a logically valid argument, e.g.:

(1) All men are mortal;

(2) Socrates is a man;

Therefore: (3) Socrates is mortal.

A logically valid argument is valid because of its logical forms, and in particular because of the logical form of its premises and conclusion. Logical validity is also intuitively modal: we typically think that, necessarily, if the premises of a logically valid argument are true, so is its conclusion. However logical form is not sufficient to explain the modal aspect of logical validity. To explain this modal aspect, Merricks thinks that we need to appeal to the notion of modal validity, which is a purely modal (non formal) notion of validity defined in terms of metaphysical modality. Thus besides logically valid arguments, Merricks thinks that there are modally valid arguments.

More precisely, for Merricks, to every logically (formally) valid argument there corresponds a modally valid argument that underpins the fact that the truth of the premises of the logically valid argument guarantees the truth of its conclusion. Validity in virtue of form alone does not capture the notion of a guarantee, which is inherently modal (p. 68). So there has to be something over and above logical validity that explains the guarantee: modal validity. In this way, for instance, Merricks argues against what he calls the 'Replacement View' (p. 67), according to which there is no metaphysical necessity or possibility, and so no modally valid arguments. This view is false because, if it were true, we would not have the resources to explain this notion of a guarantee between the truth of the premises and that of the conclusion.

Merricks may well be right that the intuitive or pre-theoretic notion of validity is modal. However, this does not means that logical consequence is modal or has to be given an account in terms of modal validity. In the course of the first two chapters, Merricks makes abundant reference to Tarski's model-theoretic account of logical consequence, which he seems to endorse. But this account is not modal. Some see it as a great problem (see for instance John Etchemendy (1990)); some think that this is actually a virtue because Tarski offers an analysis of logical consequence that is mathematically tractable in terms of quantification over all models, an analysis that does not rely on pre-theoretic or otherwise obscure notions connected to metaphysical modality. For this reason, Tarski's might be thought to be the mature concept of logical consequence that gives a precise meaning to the idea that logic is formal. On a Tarskian definition, there is no guarantee that a logical truth will be necessarily true, although one can fine-tune model theory so that it is materially adequate using some set-theoretic machinery; the notion of a guarantee is given a purely formal interpretation. There are also many proof-theoretic approaches to logical consequence that appeal to the notion of a formal proof to articulate the idea that the truth of the premises guarantees the truth of the conclusion. Proof-theoretic guarantee is a distinctively formal guarantee that does not rely on some pre-theoretic modal notion. So it simply does not seem to be the case that logical validity need rest on a more fundamental -- and I would say less tractable -- notion of modal validity.

Merricks offers another argument for the existence of modally valid arguments. It starts with the idea that 'a logic can get logical consequence wrong' (p. 65). So we need room for the notion of an argument being logically valid by the lights of a given logic but not really logically valid (p. 66). For him, this means that, to judge whether a logic is correct, we need to appeal to some modal knowledge: 'some modal knowledge is prior to accepting a system of logic, and so prior to knowledge of logical validity. Thus knowledge of logical validity stands on a foundation of modal knowledge.' (p. 67).

This argument seems to me to misfire, and this for two reasons. First, in many debates about whether a given logic is correct, logicians will typically not invoke considerations to do with metaphysical possibility. Standard arguments come from formal considerations, meta-logical considerations, considerations to do with language and meaning, epistemological considerations, considerations about rationality, etc. Crucially none of these considerations need have anything to do with modal validity.

It is also unclear how the relatively vague notion of modal validity is meant to adjudicate between different logics. For one thing, this would presuppose that we can step outside logic, as it were, take a look at which arguments are modally valid, and then on that basis judge which logic is the right logic. But many people who work on logical revision do not think that there is this vantage point outside logic -- our modal knowledge -- from where we can deliberate about whether (say) to go intuitionist or classical. There would be much less debate over which logic is the right logic if there was this modal knowledge we can just appeal to. It also seems that if there were such modal knowledge, debates over which logic is the right logic would be pointless: the right logic would be that which most closely models our knowledge of modal validity. So again I do not quite see how modally valid arguments are required to explain debates over which logic is the right logic. It may be that sometimes considerations to do with metaphysical possibility will be relevant but that need not be the norm.

II. Propositions as the constituents of modally valid arguments

Merricks' argument for the existence of propositions builds on that for the existence of modally valid arguments. It starts with the idea that modally valid arguments have to be made up of premises and conclusions that have their truth-conditions essentially (p. 5). Merricks then argues that sentences do not have their truth-conditions essentially. This is the case, for instance, because there can be 'semantic drifts', when a word gradually changes its meaning, and more generally because of context-sensitivity, and the dependence of meaning on context of use (p. 6). If sentences do not have their truth-conditions essentially, modally valid arguments cannot be made up of sentences and so they are made up of propositions.

The overall view that Merricks eventually endorses is that the premises and conclusions of logically valid arguments are sentences because sentences have logical forms. However, the premises and conclusions of modally valid arguments cannot be sentences and so are propositions. He then further argues that propositions do not have logical forms (p. 78). So in the end logically valid arguments are modally valid only insofar as they express modally valid arguments (p. 81).

What is a little difficult with what Merricks says about sentences is that it is not always clear what he means by sentences or which kinds of sentences he has in mind, especially because we go back and forth between logical and ordinary contexts. In the logical context, sentences are schemas or formulas of sort. These are typically regarded to be non-context sensitive. There is no reason why these could not have their truth-conditions essentially. In the natural language context too, there is no reason in principle as to why sentences (types or tokens) or utterances of those could not have their truth-conditions essentially. Consider for instance, a sentence of a certain language, L, uttered at a certain time t, at a certain place p, by a certain speaker s, . . . add as many parameters as you need to make it fully interpreted, unambiguous, etc. There does not seem to be a reason in principle as to why this sentence could not have its truth-conditions essentially. If sentences of both formal and natural languages can have their truth-conditions essentially, we do not need propositions to be the constituents of modally valid arguments.

III. The necessary existence of propositions

One of Merricks' key arguments is for the conclusion that propositions necessarily exist. This argument helps him to further motivate his claim that the premises and conclusions of modally valid arguments must be propositions, and it also helps him reject any account of propositions according to which they do not exist necessarily. Let us look at this argument.

Merricks starts with the claim that the following argument is modally valid (p. 10) -- necessarily, if (a) is true then (b) is true:

(a) There are no philosophers.


(b) It is not the case that Socrates is a philosopher.

Suppose with Merricks that the argument is modally valid. Merricks then claims that a conclusion cannot be true if it does not exist, and so necessarily if (a) is true then (b) exists. He uses this claim to establish that all propositions necessarily exist:

Suppose that all the premises and conclusions of modally valid arguments exist necessarily. Then the conclusion of each modally valid argument exists necessarily. Then, necessarily, if a modally valid argument's premises are true, its conclusion exists.

So far so good; he continues:

In this way, the necessary existence of all the premises and conclusions of modally valid arguments directly and elegantly explains why the truth of a modally valid argument's premises necessitates the existence of its conclusion.

That might feel a little bit quick. We need a fuller explanation. Here it is:

we have already seen that at least some of the premises and conclusions of modally valid arguments -- those that are necessarily true and those that are necessarily false -- exist necessarily. So being the premise or conclusion of a modally valid argument does not rule out existing necessarily. So it is believable -- absent of a compelling argument to the contrary -- that the premises and conclusions of modally valid arguments exist necessarily.

The premises and conclusions of modally valid arguments exist necessarily. Sentences exist only contingently . . . sentences do not constitute modally valid arguments (p. 19).

This argument, although key in establishing that propositions are the constituents of modally valid arguments, is, I think, still too quick. There is a reason for thinking that premises that are necessarily true -- say, 2+2=4 -- exist necessarily (although this is not compulsory). The idea, endorsed by Merricks, would be that where there is a necessary truth there is a necessary truth-bearer. There is a kind of symmetry there. But there is no natural way to extend this to the contingently true: why should the contingently true exist necessarily? Symmetry would rather suggest that the contingently true only exists contingently. So, pace Merricks, there is a good reason for thinking that the contingently true does not exist necessarily. We can grant that the truth-bearer has to exist; but the claim to necessary existence has no real source in the case of a premise merely contingently true; there is no modal status to be inherited. There is perhaps something nice about all the fundamental truth-bearers having the same modal profile, but that is not the sort of consideration that we are being offered.

However, this argument for the necessary existence of all propositions is crucial to Merricks' rejection of accounts of propositions whereby propositions exist contingently, for instance propositions about objects that only contingently exist (see pp. 162ff.). According to him not only do those propositions exist necessarily but propositions about objects that do not exist also exist necessarily. Merricks further assumes that sentences (whatever they turn out to be) do not necessarily exist. So if you agree with this, and if you agree that the existence of premises that are necessarily true requires the existence of truth-bearers that necessarily exist, you will agree that sentences cannot be these truth-bearers. But I think that, as it is, Merricks' chosen argumentative route for establishing the necessary existence of propositions does not quite get us there.

All in all, I am not entirely convinced by his arguments for the claim that there are modally valid arguments with propositions as constituents, and that these propositions do exist necessarily.

There are many more themes to this rich book which I do not have the space to discuss in detail, in particular Merricks' powerful arguments against mainstream accounts of propositions in Chapters 3 and 4. As said before, the book is very focused on reaching its two key goals (showing that propositions exist and showing that they have certain fundamental features) and the pace is very fast. As a result it sometimes feels like one is being rushed through arguments, some of which could have been expanded. For instance, Chapter 3 considers the possible worlds account of propositions whereby propositions are properties that are sets of their instances: the sets of worlds at which the proposition is true. Merricks argues at length against this account to conclude that if properties are sets of their instances, then possible worlds cannot be properties. One might then want to consider other accounts of properties to see if they fare better, but Merricks blankly rejects more 'expansive accounts' of properties; and that is the end of the discussion. The rejection of Fregeanism is also a bit rushed (pp. 40-1, 58-60), although some aspects of the discussion are very interesting, for instance when he considers cases of Frege's puzzle for predicates rather than singular terms (pp. 56ff.). However only the crudest version is considered and more sophisticated versions, such as causal descriptivism, are simply ignored.

Perhaps there could be a more informative index with more entries. Although the book is short, it contains very dense arguments and also very many long footnotes: the modus operandi seems to be to have neat short arguments in the body of the text and provide much of the contextual information in the footnotes. The footnotes are indeed very rich in contextual information but at times it also feels like they are taking over, and that some of the discussion would have benefitted from being expanded in the text.

It is also the case that Merricks is mostly interested in discussing accounts of validity, modality or propositions that he takes to be the 'standard' or 'most widely held' or 'mainstream' or 'orthodox' or 'received'. One feels sometimes that other avenues or views that are currently less popular could be explored. The risk here is that the book will then mostly attract philosophers with the same mindset or metaphysical agenda, when one would hope for a wider readership. This would be a great pity because Propositions is ambitious and important: it presents a very original view which should become a real contender in metaphysical discussions over the nature of propositions.